Kant and Skepticism

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Michael N. Forster, Kant and Skepticism, Princeton University Press, 2008, 154pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691129877.

Reviewed by Anthony Brueckner, University of California, Santa Barbara


In Kant and Skepticism, Michael N. Forster advances an interpretation of Kant's stance towards various forms of skepticism. Then he gauges the success of Kant's anti-skeptical views. Though Forster draws upon a great many Kantian writings, his focus is on the first Critique.

Forster begins by asking: which forms of skepticism is Kant most worried about in the first Critique? Bucking the trend of much Anglo-American Kant commentary, Forster maintains that Kant's concern with what Forster calls "veil of perception" (hereafter vop) skepticism is something of a side show, nothing more than a "secondary concern" for Kant.[1] VOP skepticism is what Kant calls "problematic idealism" in the Refutation of Idealism: it is Cartesian skepticism about knowledge of outer objects (e.g., cats) located in space. The problematic idealist "pleads the incapacity to prove, through immediate experience, any existence except our own".[2] Forster makes a fairly reasonable textual case for downplaying the role of vop skepticism in Kant's thought. Further, there has always been the prima facie worry about how to square a concern with refuting Cartesian skepticism with a full embrace of transcendental idealism. But even so, in a book entitled Kant and Skepticism, one would have expected, for the sake of completeness, more than Forster's perfunctory treatment of the Refutation of Idealism and at least some discussion of the bearing of the Transcendental Deduction on vop skepticism. I will return to the latter issue later, and regarding the former, I note briefly the following criticism from Forster. Kant's premise in the Refutation of Idealism is "I am conscious of my own existence as determined in time".[3] One plausible construal is that I know that I have had "mental states in a certain order over a stretch of time" (fn. 22, 97). However, according to Forster, "no 'veil of perception' skeptic worth his salt will concede this claim" (97). Against this, Cartesian skepticism is not about memory and does not challenge the sorts of knowledge about our own minds to which common sense lays claim (such as knowledge of the temporal ordering of at least some of our mental states). As Kant saw it, the Cartesian problem is about how to move from knowledge of our own minds to knowledge of the world apart from our minds. Kant claims to have solved that problem in the Refutation of Idealism. What is wrong with his alleged solution (inquiring minds would like to know)?

Which skeptical problems were of primary concern to Kant, on Forster's telling? Forster highlights Kant's worries about Pyrrhonian skepticism, which have been largely overlooked in the vast jungle of Kant commentary. Kant thought that metaphysical claims about the supersensible realm (e.g., the world as a whole, the human soul, and God) were subject to Pyrrhonian equipollence: equally strong arguments could be given for and against such claims, leading the metaphysician to suspend judgementregarding the claims. The Antinomies of Pure Reason were Kant's paradigmatic examples of Pyrrhonian equipollence, engendering skepticism about the possibility of genuine metaphysical knowledge.

The second sort of skepticism that clearly worried Kant was Humean in nature. This skepticism focused on two related conundrums. First, it seemed clear to Kant that there are genuine a priori concepts with (broadly speaking) experiencable instances in the world, such as the concept of causal necessity. These concepts are not "derivable without remainder from sensation" (26). Insofar as Kant was loath to simply dismiss out of hand Hume's "no impression, no idea" principle, the existence of such a priori concepts was deeply puzzling to him. Second, the causal principle -- "Every event has a cause" -- seemed clearly true to Kant. However, he agreed with Hume that (1) the causal principle is not knowable on experiential grounds, and yet (2) its denial does not imply a contradiction. Given (2), the principle is not analytic, and given (1), it is not knowable a posteriori. Hence the puzzle of the synthetic a priori.

On Forster's understanding of Kant, the solution to the Humean skeptic's puzzles lies in Kant's appeal to "transcendental arguments". The backbone of a transcendental argument, on Forster's account, is a conditional proposition of the form "Necessarily if there is experience (of such-and-such a type), then a priori concept C refers/synthetic a priori principle p is true". We can detach the consequent of such a conditional given the "seemingly unquestionable truth of its antecedent", which concerns the existence of a certain type of experience (41). Such conditionals enable us to establish metaphysical results without depending upon any objectionable claims about the supersensible realm.

According to Forster, Kant thinks that he must not only prove metaphysical results such as (a) the a priori concept of causal necessity refers, and (b) the causal principle is true. Kant thinks that he must also explain the possibility of such metaphysical knowledge. The reader knows where we are heading -- into the wonderful world of transcendental idealism. If the reader is looking for enlightenment on this subject, Forster's book is of no help. Here is a typical example of Forster on transcendental idealism: "How can I know a priori (despite the non-analyticity of the claim) that, for example, every event has a cause? Because I constitute reality to conform with this principle" (44). While it is true that Forster's agenda in his short book is confined to Kant on skepticism, such a book really ought to say more about the nature of transcendental idealism. How, for example, does it differ from Berkeleyan idealism? Is it a ridiculous view? Does Kant's response to Humean skepticism collapse if transcendental idealism is false? With regard to the last question, we might wonder what Forster thinks about the Strawsonian project of jettisoning the transcendental idealist explanation of how transcendental arguments are possible.[4] If these arguments' backbone conditionals can be established without appeal to transcendental idealism, then Strawson would be vindicated, and philosophy would be immeasurably enriched.[5] One last point about Kant's answer to Humean skepticism: if Kant could establish that a priori concepts such as causal necessity and substance refer to genuine instances in the world of experience, then this would at least bear some relevance to Cartesian vop skepticism (would it not?). Are the results of the Transcendental Deduction just irrelevant to Cartesian skepticism, as Forster seems to claim?[6]

Kant's response to the Humean skeptic is also a partial response to the Pyrrhonian equipollence skeptic. This is because, in Kant's view, the Pyrrhonian "does not in general question experiential judgements" such as the antecedents of the backbone conditionals of transcendental arguments (47). Given those conditionals, and given that the Pyrrhonian will not question logical principles, even this skeptic is bound to detach the metaphysical propositions that constitute the conditionals' consequents. Against this, we might ask Kant why there could not be a new Antinomy generated by a counter-argument proceeding from equally persuasive premises, say a proof of the denial of the causal principle. In Forster's own critical discussion of the foregoing part of Kant's response to the Pyrrhonian, Forster suggests that a committed skeptic might well follow Hegel and question both logical principles and assumptions about the nature of experience, thereby thwarting the reined-in metaphysician's appeal to Kantian transcendental arguments.

To complete the Kantian response to the Pyrrhonian skeptic, Forster notes the following Kantian views: (A) Transcendental idealism explains why the Pyrrhonist was right about the canonical Antinomies: metaphysical knowledge regarding the supersensible is indeed impossible. (B) The transcendental idealist explanation of the possibility of genuine metaphysical knowledge via transcendental arguments is itself legitimate metaphysical knowledge in virtue of its "apodeictic certainty". (C) No metaphysical knowledge other than that which is vindicated by the first Critique is possible, because the critical philosophy is complete, forming an entire system that leaves out no metaphysical knowledge.

Perhaps the most interesting part of Kant and Skepticism is Forster's critical discussion of Kant's "failures of self-reflection". As noted, Kant's claims to completeness are crucial to his case against the Pyrrhonian skeptic. Forster accordingly bashes the Metaphysical Deduction (a favorite whipping boy of Kant scholarship), in which Kant claims to tell the whole story about the logical forms of judgement and the associated a priori concepts -- the categories. Forster also registers the standard complaint that Kant should not be able to count any of his claims about things in themselves as amounting to knowledge claims. But Forster does add this wrinkle: Kant's claims about transcendental idealism are neither analytic nor known through experience; therefore they must be synthetic a priori; but Kant's form of explanation of the possibility of metaphysical knowledge of the synthetic a priori cannot apply here; this is because we cannot hold that "the synthetic a priori thesis of transcendental idealism is itself known in virtue of its being mind-imposed" (67, last emphasis mine).

Forster's most provocative criticism of Kant's anti-Humeanism begins with a well-known question: what is the status of the backbone conditionals of transcendental arguments? Forster's wrinkle is to give a novel argument that Kant faces a problematic dilemma. Consider the backbone conditional for a transcendental argument aimed at establishing the truth of a synthetic a priori principle, say the causal principle. Either the backbone conditional is analytic, or it is synthetic. Suppose the conditional is analytic. According to Forster, for Kant, synthetic a priori principles must be "interpreted as restricted in their scope to relevant (objects of) experience" (65, author's emphasis). In the case of the causal principle, this restriction has the consequence that the backbone conditional has the form:

For all x, if x is an experiencable objective temporal event, then x has a cause.

But now it is obvious that we cannot take this universally quantified conditional to be analytic. Whatever exactly our universal claim about causation turns out to be, it is not supposed to turn out to be an analytic a priori claim.[7]

On the second horn of the dilemma, we suppose that the backbone conditional is synthetic. The conditional is a priori as well. But "Kant requires … that no synthetic a priori proposition of metaphysics be accepted until it has received a satisfactory justification" (65). Whatever the justifying argument for the conditional might be, it will contain at least one synthetic a priori premise φ. But what is the justifying argument for φ itself? Whatever it is, the argument will contain at least one synthetic a priori premise ψ. But what is the justifying argument for ψ itself …

Forster thinks that an analogous dilemma holds for transcendental arguments purporting to establish the successful reference of a priori concepts. The "synthetic horn" of the dilemma is again the generation of a regress argument of the kind just considered. The "analytic horn" runs as follows. Suppose that the concept experience of kind E contains the target a priori concept C, so that "If there is experience of kind E, then C genuinely refers" is analytic. It would follow, according to Forster, that the concept experience of kind E is itself an a priori concept. But then why should the Humean skeptic simply grant that the latter is a genuine concept, when the very existence of genuine a priori concepts is under debate? Though Forster does not put the point in this way, it is as if we say to the Humean skeptic: "Surely you grant that the concept of red necessitating cause has genuine reference. That concept contains the concept of necessitating cause. So that a priori concept has genuine reference."

The "synthetic horns" of the dilemmas could perhaps be avoided. Perhaps a Kantian theorist could maintain that some synthetic a priori propositions are non-inferentially justified, just as is the case, on a foundationalist view, with some synthetic a posteriori propositions. Such a move, however, takes us back to Forster's query: Is it really open to Kant to hold that basic, primitive metaphysical knowledge of synthetic a priori propositions, such as "Transcendental idealism is true", simply get a pass in virtue of their "apodeictic certainty"?

Though Kant and Skepticism is a rather slender work that leaves the reader wanting more, sir, please, it is a very helpful addition to the corpus of Kant commentary. It is clearly and elegantly written, and anyone interested in Kant on skepticism should read it.

[1] See Kant and Skepticism (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2008), p. 11. All subsequent page references in the text are to Forster's book.

[2] Critique of Pure Reason, B275.

[3] Critique of Pure Reason, B275.

[4] See P.F. Strawson's The Bounds of Sense (London: Methuen, 1966).

[5] More on this later.

[6] It is the schematised categories that apply to the spatio-temporal world. So the Schematism must be conjoined with the Transcendental Deduction in order to get the results in question.

[7] This is my own reconstruction of Forster's reasoning.