Kant and Spinozism: Transcendental Idealism and Immanence from Jacobi to Deleuze

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Beth Lord, Kant and Spinozism: Transcendental Idealism and Immanence from Jacobi to Deleuze, Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 214pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230552975.

Reviewed by Paul Davies, University of Sussex


Over the past couple of decades, interest has developed in what we might come to call the post-critical Kant, the author of the strange collection of writings which seem to take their cue from some of the concerns in the Third Critique's account of teleological judgment and then to extend and to apply them politically, theologically, and bio-physically. With much interpretative effort and an occasional stretching of plausibility, these extensions or applications -- unfinished and hesitant -- can come to be deemed ambiguous as between clarifying or revising the critical project of transcendental idealism on the one hand and undermining or even breaking with it on the other. Whatever we decide and whatever the outcome, it may be that a significant contributor to post-Kantian idealism and its alternatives is and will be Kant himself.

The motivations for the critique of teleology (for critique's needing to turn its attention to teleology) are complex. In Kant's hands, they and the resulting critique leave us with a series of seemingly incompatible claims or positions, among which we can include: (1) atheism must be unthinkable; (2) we have not yet sufficiently comprehended the role and sense of purpose, thus its critique is not yet completed; (3) purposiveness must be thought (transcendentally) as implicating and contributing to a genuine philosophy of nature; (4) the metaphysics of subjectivity must be coextensive with the metaphysics of a meaningful and purposive life; (5) with respect to its theoretical or cognitive operations, reason can only claim a priori access to their formal aspects; and (6) the ongoing critique of purpose seems to require our thinking critically about nature and the natural sciences in such a way as to move beyond form to content.

This last claim arguably finds its most controversial formulation in the Opus Postumum's treatment of the ether where Kant seems to concede a more than formal aspect and role to space, a space that nevertheless remains a priori intuitable. Such a concession leaves transcendental philosophy with a dilemma. To avoid capitulating to a pre-critical transcendent and theistic realism, this new deduction of content must eschew the return of a real purposiveness. But this seems to entail that the formal appeal to subjective and objective purposiveness, which was both a condition of critical reason and a reward for the critical constraining of reason, must also be challenged or weakened. Transcendental philosophy can acquire more content only at the price of less meaning or purpose. It can engage anew and critically with the question of matter but only by losing something of the character and definition of the critique that broke so confidently with dogmatic metaphysics. So stated, it is perhaps not surprising that in reflecting on this peculiar late trajectory, we find a nagging concern with the possibility that there could be a good, wise, and rational person, and a good, wise, and rational metaphysics, capable of admitting and living with a cosmic purposelessness. It is not surprising that the concerns of these late writings sometimes bring to mind the question of Spinoza and of the possible coherence of a philosophy, like Spinoza's, being held rationally and morally, for is there not something in such a philosophy, a metaphysics that is neither simply synonymous with atheism nor simply dogmatic, that requires furthercritical attention, something that must continue to trouble Kant and us, we "post-Kantians?"

And of course, German idealism after Kant often finds itself re-engaging with Spinozism. Beth Lord's short but ambitious comparative study offers a reading of these re-engagements. It takes us from Jacobi's "provocative suggestion" that Kant and Spinoza be reconciled through Herder's and Maimon's diagnoses, respectively, of Spinoza's naturalism and idealism, and brings us finally to Kant's ether, and to the posthumous outline of a partnership: Kant with Spinoza contra the world of (German) idealism. This movement does not seek finally to align Kant with Spinozism, as though the two thinkers say the same thing, but rather to understand the changes in the means by which Kant continues to distinguish himself from Spinoza. In contrast to the tradition (ultimately of course a Hegelian tradition) in which Kant, Spinoza and their idealisms are contextualised and absolutized, and in which thought and being are reconciled in an absolute identification, Lord invites us to see Spinoza and Kant, the latter no doubt despite himself, as insisting on the non-negotiable realism of thought's impact on being and being's impact on thought, and the realism here is threefold: real thought, real being, real interruptive impact. It is an intriguing and suggestive narrative, and Lord tells it well. Kant's critical project, generally understood as a protective and legitimizing one, is interrupted at crucial moments and on crucial topics where transcendental reason must yield a positive result or description.

These are moments and topics where the protective and legitimizing tone no longer suffices. Critical reason can be surprised, must advance in ways it could not and cannot predict, and must come to apprehend itself as something other than it took itself to be where this surprise and apprehension are not simply to be diagnosed as the effects of dogmatic error or uncritical precedence. The impossibility of simply and finally settling the question of purpose is one such moment and topic and as a consequence so much else remains unsettled: the nature of critical reason, the ontology of the subject, and the meanings of theism, pantheism, and atheism. Under the heading and challenge of a certain 'Spinozism,' the critical project is called or obliged to go further. Each of Lord's chapters manages both to draw out elements that hint at the conclusion (the alliance in difference of Kant and Spinoza) and add to the understanding of her primary sources. In each chapter we first get a greater feel for the problem Spinozism poses for critical philosophy and then get to see how that philosophy must change in order better to deal with it.

Summarised in this fashion, we have a book which serves as an interesting contribution to the secondary literature on German Idealism and which gives an optimistic endorsement of the supposed Kantian contribution to a substantive (critical or post-critical) metaphysics. The lines between and from Jacobi, Herder, and Maimon are well drawn, and if the study, for the sake of its Spinozistic inclinations, overlooks or fails to emphasize the harder idealistic commitments of Fichte or Schelling, or indeed Hegel, surely it is enough for the reader to know that there are other places and sources to go to for all of that. What we have, as the modest opening sentence makes clear, is a book "about the developing relation between Kant and Spinozism from 1785 to about 1800." The book is a historically informed study of the sensitivity to Spinozism we can more or less convincingly read into the later Kant and, from the standpoint of that later Kant, of the sensitivity to Spinozism we can begin to detect in the writings of some of his more critically nuanced readers and followers. (Maimon, and Lord's treatment of Maimon, in many ways the highlight of the book, fare particularly well here.)

Yet, summarised in this fashion, we can miss what is most striking and difficult about Kant and Spinozism. Although Kant or various carefully selected bits of Kant's writing can be read so as to bring him into proximity with Spinoza, why should we adopt such a reading? It often looks as though Lord so wants to find another Kant, one she can productively link with Spinoza, that any remark or revision that seems not to fit the orthodoxy of Kantian critical philosophy is secured in advance and given as evidence of such a link. In such instances the absence of textual support for her interpretation paradoxically works in its favour. They become exceptional, difficult, and interruptive hypotheses or proposals that require another "non-Kantian" context to become intelligible.

But why desire such an end, and why go to such ingenious lengths to achieve it? There is after all a dominant account of the development of German Idealism, one which also notes the inability of a Kantian critical reason to preserve its purely formal character and one in and for which the question of intellectual intuition and so of the inevitable transcendental re-investment in an a priori content continues to be raised. And this account might find itself concluding with the Hegelian reading not only of Jacobi, Herder and Maimon, but also explicitly and thematically of the Spinozism of which they struggled to make critical sense. In other words there must be an argument as to why that dominant account is not being considered here. How can it be so lightly discarded? In none of the chapters devoted to Jacobi, Herder, or Maimon, neither in the primary sources themselves nor in Lord's commentaries on them, do we explicitly find this central philosophical argument. Nor is it to be found, regardless of how it might be hoped for, in any of the passages from Spinoza or Kant that Lord cites, alludes to, or unpacks. However subtle Lord's Kantian and Spinozistic exegeses, their motivation and force comes from elsewhere, and although it would be very easy and profitable to spend a lot of time discussing some of the details of the interpretations of the five key historical figures, for the remainder of this brief review, I would like to address the figure Lord invokes to organize and justify the entire project.

The book may introduce itself as being "about the developing relation between Kant and Spinozism from 1785 to about 1800," but that introduction already sits a little awkwardly with the subtitle, "Transcendental Idealism and Immanence from Jacobi to Deleuze." Now of course there is no need for anyone in a book on Spinoza (or Kant) to apologize for referencing Deleuze. His first book on Spinoza is, I think, one of the best books ever written on him, an exemplary instance of a major philosopher writing a major work on a major philosopher, and Deleuze's writings on Kant, irritated and affectionate but always insistent on his significance and unavoidability, likewise require no apology. The addition of yet another primary figure to this already highly condensed study is handled so well that it is a burden neither to the study nor to the reader, and Lord is an excellent and helpful guide to Deleuze's thought. Nevertheless, his role in the book is clearly over determined. Deleuze is the philosopher whose account of difference and immanence provides the framework and much of the detail for Lord's underlying argument. The "from . . . to" in "from Jacobi to Deleuze" is different in kind from that in "from 1785 to about 1800," and it is a Deleuzian thesis or assumption, a Deleuzian check to idealism, that prevents the study's extending to Hegel, rather than a scholarly decision to focus on a particular historical period. The step indicated in the subtitle, from Jacobi to Deleuze, is philosophical rather than historical, and the study is best seen as a Deleuzian inflected investigation into a topic, itself selected on broadly Deleuzian grounds.

I do not have time here to go into much detail but there is an ambiguity in the role Lord asks Deleuze to play. On the one hand, and straightforwardly in his commentaries on Spinoza and in the development of his own philosophy, Deleuze can present himself and be presented as standing with Spinoza and Maimon over and against Kant. On the other hand, as Lord wants to argue, Deleuze can be thought alongside Spinoza and Kant in a final polemical contrast with idealism. How do we get to this second Deleuze? Lord's argument for this final alliance requires a Deleuzian reading of the means by which Kant, no matter how complex the critique of purpose becomes, continues to sustain a distance from Spinozistic immanence. In the end, it seems, Kant can be won over for the philosophy of difference by treating his refinements of a critical project in response to an ever more troubling Spinozism as evidence of a concern (albeit critical and transcendental) with difference. We seem to have three Deleuzes: (1) Deleuze with Spinoza, (2) Deleuze with Spinoza and Kant, and (3) a Deleuze who reads the transition that is Kant's encounter with Spinozism so as to bring us from (1) to (2). Any reader of Deleuze can find the first. Lord wants to help us find the second. And the third? Note that it is going to have to be a Deleuze who reads a transition in the history of philosophy. It thus presupposes a Deleuzian approach to the history of philosophy. What could such an approach be?

Deleuze has never had much patience with talk of the end or the overcoming of philosophy, whether it be in the guise of an easy Carnapian positivism or in the guise of a nuanced Heideggerean and Derridian 'closure'. A major part of the appeal of Deleuze's readings of other philosophers is often the ease with which he celebrates and affirms their inventiveness and creativity, the possibility for philosophy and metaphysics that their writing exemplifies, and the writer might be Spinoza, Bergson, Nietzsche, Hume, or Foucault, might be someone who in other hands is always taken to have announced or accepted such an end or overcoming. Is this perhaps not part of what makes Deleuze's relations with Kant so complicated?

Kant is both a creative metaphysician and a writer who would legislate that creativity in the name of a higher or prior critical responsibility. A Kant who Deleuze would read productively would need to be disentangled from this rhetoric of legitimation. Kant must be resisted in order to be read. However, it is precisely the Kant who calls into question the possibility of metaphysics who initiates the discourse of the end of metaphysics and who prepares the way for the speculative, positive, destructive and deconstructive histories and retrievals of metaphysics. There are surely sound reasons for thinking that Deleuze deliberately refrains from giving a history of philosophy or a way of retrieving or rethinking the history of philosophy. Lord's argument, however, requires her to envisage a Deleuzian thinking of a transition. What could it be and how could it proceed? More importantly, if such a Deleuzian reading is possible, what prevents its being extended to any of the philosophers who continue to be comfortably contained, as Kant once was, under the heading of idealism? What in their works and in idealism itself prevents the unfolding of difference and the detection of traces of immanence? If the trick can be done with Kant, why not with Fichte or Hegel -- the history of philosophy retold or re-thought as a history of difference?[1]

To conclude: This is a well written book, of help and interest to anyone concerned with Deleuze, German Idealism, Spinoza, and Kant. It handles its extensive primary literature admirably, and attempts to weave together at least two arguments, one historical, the other philosophical. Sometimes each of these arguments is called on to complete or to underwrite the other in a manner that perhaps begs the question, and more should certainly have been said to clarify the role Deleuze is playing in each. But what we have is never less than thought-provoking and I have no doubt that Lord has much more to say on these matters. I look forward to hearing what it is.

[1] It occurs to me that the one place where Deleuze perhaps does try to read a philosopher in terms of an epoch is his book on Leibniz; I find it the least successful of his monographs, and this in stark contrast to his wonderful lectures on Leibniz.