Kant and the Concept of Community

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Charlton Payne and Lucas Thorpe (eds.), Kant and the Concept of Community, University of Rochester Press, 2011, 321pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781580463874.

Reviewed by Justin Shaddock, Dominican University


Kant and the Concept of Community brings a necessary unity to the manifold of Kant studies. The courses we take as students and teach as professors, as well as the papers and books we read and write, often cover only a single area of Kant's philosophy. A few collections do treat all of Kant's works, yet the essays in even these collections often stand in isolation. This would be unfortunate in any field, but since Kant is such a systematic philosopher, we should expect especially revealing connections here.[1] Kant and the Concept of Community brings together some of today's most eminent Kant scholars to argue for the thesis that Kant's many conceptions of community in his theoretical, practical, aesthetic, religious, and political philosophy are all "modeled on the concept of community found in the table of categories and judgments." (2) In this review, I will assess this thesis by briefly examining the volume's thirteen essays. I will suggest in closing that there is another dimension of Kant's philosophy that ought to be unified. It is not across the various areas of his thought, but across the disparate doctrines he endorses over time.

BĂ©atrice Longuenesse contributes an essay on Kant's derivation of the category of community from the disjunctive form of judgment in the first Critique. By the disjunctive form of judgment, she explains, "one divides a concept, say a, into mutually exclusive specifications of this concept, say b, c, d, e," and "consider[s] the assertion of any one of the specifications (b, c, d, or e) of the divided concept a, as a sufficient condition for negating the others, and conversely consider[s] the negation of all but one as a sufficient condition for asserting the remaining one." (21) Kant then derives the category of community, according to Longuenesse, by reasoning that

just as in a disjunctive judgment, the sphere of a concept … is divided into its subordinate spheres, so that these subordinate spheres are in a relation of mutual determination while at the same time excluding one another, so in a material whole, things mutually determine one another, or even in one material thing or body considered as a whole, the parts are in a relation of mutual attraction and repulsion. (24-25)

Kant's argument in the Third Analogy is that since our representations are always successive, our cognition of simultaneity presupposes our application of the category of community, and the upshot for Longuenesse is that "objects are … individuated in space and time by their reciprocal interaction, and concepts of objects thus individuated are concepts of relational properties." (31)

Many of these points are repeated and extended in Eric Watkins's essay on Kant's theoretical philosophy. He explains that the disjunctive form of judgment divides a logical space into mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive spheres, that the category of community reciprocally coordinates substances and their states, that the schematized category of community "states that if two (empirically knowable) substances stand in mutual interaction, then their states (or determinations) must be simultaneous," (47) and that the Third Analogy specifies that this "mutual interaction must be understood in terms of substances jointly determining their states in such a way that the causal activity of the one depends on that of the other (and vice versa)." (52) Watkins then explains how the concept of community features in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, in Kant's theory of how matter fills space by exerting reciprocal repulsive forces and in his theory of the equality of action and reaction.

Lucas Thorpe promises to connect Kant's theoretical and practical philosophy, but his essay fails to fulfill this promise. Thorpe explains that Kant rejects his predecessors' theories of physical influx, occasionalism, and pre-established harmony, since none can account for the real interaction among essentially active substances. Kant's own theory, on Thorpe's interpretation, is that the substances in a community must be governed by laws legislated by those substances themselves and so "must be autonomous." (80) But one wonders how this can be right. Thorpe's interpretation would seem to contradict the first Critique's doctrine that the objects of our possible experience necessarily stand under the category of community, and in so doing it would also seem to negate any connection between the first and second Critiques.

Paul Guyer focuses on Kant's conceptions of community in his practical philosophy. He argues that the realm of ends is "the goal of our moral choice of maxims … enjoining us to treat all rational beings with whom we may interact as ends in themselves and to seek a systematic union of the particular ends freely chosen by all such rational beings," that the moral world is "the realization of the goal of the realm of ends," and that the highest good is "the condition that would result from the realization of the moral world … under ideal conditions, in which … the virtue of all would make all happy." (117-118) Guyer also traces a development in Kant's thinking. He argues that in the first Critique Kant incoherently postulates God's creation of nature as a condition of the possibility of the highest good in the afterlife, and that he equally incoherently postulates God's creation of nature in the second Critique in order to make our moral perfection in the afterlife possible. Guyer argues that Kant finally reaches a coherent view in his writings of the 1790's (including the third Critique, "On the Common Saying: 'That May Be Correct in Theory, but It Is of No Use in Practice,'" and Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason), where he postulates God "as the condition of the possibility of the existence of the 'ethical community,' which is an earthly condition of cooperation that facilitates the development of … virtue" (108)

Allen Wood aims to elucidate Kant's definition of religion, given in his Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, as the subjective attitude toward our moral duties as commanded by God. Wood argues that for Kant radical evil is our propensity to prefer the satisfaction of our empirical desires to duty, and since its source is our social tendency to value ourselves over others, we can overcome it only by "adopting ends that … agree (or even coincide) with the ends of other human beings, and that they do so by directly fulfilling the idea of a 'realm' in which all ends form … a mutually supporting system." (130) On Wood's account, Kant defines religiousness as subjectively regarding our duties as God's commands, because such a mutually supporting system would constitute an ethical community, and its laws would have to be regarded by its members as God's legislation. One wonders, however, whether Guyer's and Wood's accounts of the Religion are compatible. While for Guyer Kant maintains that we must postulate God as an objective condition of the possibility of the existence of the ethical community, for Wood Kant holds only that we members of the ethical community must subjectively regard our duties as legislated by God.

The topic of Onora O'Neill's essay is Kant's distinction between public and private reason in "What is Enlightenment?" and "What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?" She explains that private reason derives its authority from some source other than reason (for example, a country's legal code, a religion's official teaching, or an economy's organizing principles), and so carries conviction only for those who also already acknowledge that other source. Public reason alone confers fundamental justifications, she explains, because it is governed by laws that hold for all in virtue of reason's self-legislation. O'Neill concludes that

the form of independence that counts for Kantian autonomy is not the independence of the individual 'legislator' but rather the independence of the principle 'legislated' from whatever desires, decisions, powers, or conventions may be current among one or another group. (147)

But here one wonders whether it is not equally important to emphasize the point that individual legislators must be independent of their particular practical identities (for example, as an American, a Christian, or a Capitalist), as it is to stress the point O'Neill rightly makes that legislated principles must be independent of the commitments of the group or groups to which they belong.

Jeffrey Edwards writes on Kant's theory of property in the Metaphysics of Morals. Edwards sets out two prima facie problems. The first is how "the achievement of empirical possession through first possession-taking" can be "consistent with the categorical prescriptions of right involved in the concept of universal will." (156) Kant's answer, on Edwards's account, is that "the original possession of an external object can only be possession in common." (157) But this leads Edwards to a second problem, "why should acquisition through unilateral occupation receive the favor of any law of right if it represents the type of control-seizing act that can generate a condition of universal conflict by virtue of the dynamical community of all possessive agents?" (167) Edwards's answer attributes to Kant a "principle of equality in distribution," according to which, "we may place upon all others an obligation to refrain from using certain objects … only insofar as this does not bind all others, in their use of objects, to refrain from more than we are reciprocally bound by all of them to refrain from using." (174) Edwards admits that this is not a principle Kant himself articulates, but he maintains that it is required by a charitable interpretation.

Michael Feola considers whether Kant's practical philosophy can be defended against the Hegelian criticism that it is overly individualistic. On Feola's interpretation, Kant is not crudely individualistic, but recognizes the ethical community's role in overcoming our social tendency to evil. Yet, for Feola, Kant nevertheless posits a unidirectional dependence of the ethical community on reason, and it is this unidirectionality that Hegel criticizes. On Feola's interpretation, "Kant posits a unilinear relationship of influence from a priori principles to the social world," (195) and Hegel counters that

our normative bonds do not follow from imposing an a priori principle upon a recalcitrant or wayward social domain. Rather, we are born into a world that already makes rational claims upon us through the traditions and practices that articulate the meaningful ends of human life, as particularized within this community (196).

While Feola offers a very clear picture of this Hegelian criticism, he goes further and endorses it, but unfortunately without any more than a sketch of an argument.

Another criticism of Kant's practical philosophy is raised in Ronald Beiner's essay. Beiner points out a tension between Kant's moral egalitarianism and his theory of citizenship. On one hand, Kant's moral egalitarianism is the view that all human subjects deserve equal respect on account of our free rational nature. Kant's view of citizenship, on the other hand, distinguishes between active and passive citizens. "Passive citizens," Beiner explains, "include women, children, and those who are economically dependent on a 'master." (211-212) The tension arises, according to Beiner, since for Kant citizenship is a moral category, in that "the state acknowledges our freedom as human beings and grants us equality as subjects" (219), and yet "independence, rather than being an entailment of citizenship as a properly moral status, instead becomes the condition of an experience of full citizenship that is available to some but not available to others." (218) There is no doubt that Beiner is correct in identifying this tension, but Kant's prejudice, while reprehensible, is hardly news.

Susan Shell challenges theorists who maintain that the European Union attains Kantian political ideals. She argues that for Kant rights and duties go hand in hand: "Citizenship implies not only a willingness to pay taxes or affective feelings of belonging but also, first and foremost, a reciprocal right and duty of mutual defense." (237) She argues, however, that "the European Union constitutional draft has much to say about the 'rights' of citizens, but little to say about their 'duties." (236) Shell's conclusion is that "if Europe cannot be a federal nation-state (along U.S. lines), it would be better off as a federation of nation-states along genuinely Kantian lines." (239)

The final three essays by Charlton Payne, Jane Kneller, and Jan Mieszkowski treat Kant's notion of the "sensus communis," but none connects the conceptions of community in Kant's first or second Critiques to this notion in his third. Payne assesses the extent to which the model of a "sensus communis" can be employed to understand political action, Kneller considers whether this model can be employed to understand judgments about communities other than our own, and Mieszkowski argues that it provides a model for a superior alternative to Habermas's communicative action theory. These are all interesting essays in their own right, but since none supports the volume's thesis that Kant employs one concept of community in the many areas of his thought, I will not consider them in more detail here.

Let me instead suggest that this volume might have traced the development of Kant's thinking about community across the various views he held over time. To be sure, Guyer traces a development in Kant's practical philosophy, and Thorpe lays out the options of Kant's predecessors in theoretical philosophy, including the theories of physical influx, occasionalism, and pre-established harmony. But in Kant's own 1770 Inaugural Dissertation, he espouses a thesis that he calls "generally established harmony," with which he aims to combine elements of pre-established harmony and physical influx.[2] Kant later rejects pre-established harmony in two important texts. First, in a 1772 letter to Marcus Herz, he rejects it for inviting the dogmatic stipulation that any and all of our non-empirically derived concepts might apply to objects.[3] Then in the 1787 B-edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, he rejects pre-established harmony again, but now for granting the skeptical wish that the categories might apply to objects just because of the a priori constitution of our subjectivity.[4]

In light of this, we should not interpret Kant's mature idealism as the thesis that the objects of our possible experience have a categorial structure just because of their dependence upon our subjectivity's a priori constitution. Kant would regard such an idealism as tantamount to skepticism. Of course, Kant does not espouse the transcendental realist conception of objectivity and subjectivity as wholly independent either. We should rather interpret his idealism as positing an interdependence, or reciprocity, between the objects of our possible experience and our finite cognitive subjectivity. Moreover, once this interpretation of Kantian idealism is in place, we should also give more weight to an interpretation of Kantian autonomy not as representing individuals as legislating the moral law into authority, but rather as involving a similar reciprocity between our finite agential subjectivity and the moral law's authority.

Of course, this impugns no particular essay in this collection, nor its overall thesis. It is surely revealing to examine the systematic interconnections in Kant's thought, and this collection provides a worthwhile study of Kant's concept of community. I have argued that it might have been even more illuminating, however, had it also examined the historical development of Kant's thinking about community in his theoretical philosophy. Understanding Kant's own reasons for rejecting his early views should give us insight into his mature positions.

[1] The single-authored work that gives the best treatment of this problem, to my mind, is Karl Ameriks's Interpreting Kant's Critiques (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004).

[2] Immanuel Kant, On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World, in Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770, trans. David Walford (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992), 2: 409.

[3] Immanuel Kant, "Letter to Marcus Herz, February 21, 1772," in Correspondence, trans. Arnulf Zweig (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), 10:131.

[4] Immanuel Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998), B167-168.