Kant and the Concept of Race: Late Eighteenth-Century Writings

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Jon M. Mikkelsen (ed., tr.), Kant and the Concept of Race: Late Eighteenth-Century Writings, SUNY Press, 2013, 377pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438443614.

Reviewed by John H. Zammito, Rice University


This is a very important contribution for those who cannot read German and who wish to gain a purchase on the role of Kant in the highly contested domain of race theory and the less politicized but also contested domain of philosophy of biology. Not only does it provide key texts from Kant on the question of race, but it also supplements these with texts, previously not available in English, from four important German contemporaries of Kant. Jon Mikkelsen presents these texts in chronological order: Kant's first essay on race, in its two distinct versions of 1775 and 1777 (an unprecedented and very welcome contribution for those who are interested in close historical reading of Kant's development on these questions); E. A. W. Zimmermann's criticisms of Kant in the context of his own biogeographical study of the human population, Geographical History of Human Beings and the Universally Dispersed Quadrupeds (1778); Kant's "Determination of the Concept of a Human Race" (1785); Georg Forster's critical commentary on that essay, "Something More about the Human Races" (1786); Kant's rejoinder, "On the Use of Teleological Principles in Philosophy" (1788), of fundamental importance for the development of his third Critique; Christoph Meiners' "Of the Varieties and Deviate Forms of Negroes" (1790), an exemplary text from perhaps the most racist theorist of late eighteenth-century Germany; and, finally, an excerpt from Christoph Girtanner's Concerning the Kantian Principle in Natural History (1796), the most thorough endeavor to apply Kant's approach to the emergent field of life science, associated with the work of Johann Friedrich Blumenbach in Göttingen. Mikkelsen's volume is supplemented with an extensive Chronology of developments in race theory, the slave trade, and the life sciences from 1619 to 1859.

The critical issue concerning this volume is its relation to the increasingly standard English translations of Kant's texts, the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, in this case, the volume Anthropology, History, and Education, edited by Günter Zöller and Robert Louden (Cambridge University Press, 2007). Both editions contain careful translations of Kant's texts on race. Each set of translations has its strengths and weaknesses. For general readability, perhaps the Cambridge Edition is superior, but Mikkelsen tends to retain more of the eighteenth-century flavor of Kant's language, as attested by the works from contemporaries. Each translation indulges in some terminological anachronism. The Cambridge Edition chooses to use phylum for the German Stamm. That sounds too much like a present taxonomical category for Kant's deliberately ordinary (eighteenth-century) language. But Mikkelsen translates as plates what the Cambridge Edition more sensibly renders as plateaus. Plates, once again, evokes too contemporary a geological framework. But the case for Mikkelsen's volume does not lie in translation quality but in conceptual orientation.

Both volumes reflect the very late attentiveness of Anglophone scholarship to Kant's texts on race and their relation to his overall corpus and concerns. More, this belatedness looms especially problematic in light of the explosive implications of these texts and others, now appearing in the Cambridge Edition, from Kant's lectures on physical geography and anthropology for the question of Kant's racism. While the Cambridge Edition's general introduction acknowledges this context in about five pages and with one footnote reference to a proliferating secondary literature, a brevity perhaps justified by the much wider collection of texts comprising that volume, there is a much more extensive discussion of this heated present-day theoretical debate in the volume by Mikkelsen. His "Translator's Introduction" is a very careful essay in the historiography of recent work on Kant and race, recognizing the triggering intervention of Emmanuel Eze and then Tsenay Serequeberhan in the early 1990s, both reflecting a sharp post-colonialist critique of Eurocentrism. Mikkelsen then recounts the ensuing inquiry into these questions by Kant specialists, notably Mark Larrimore, Robert Bernasconi, Robert Louden, and Pauline Kleingeld, but with an exhaustive bibliography attached. His appraisals are thoughtful and persuasive, and they indicate that the question has not been definitively resolved. This will be decisive for the wider reception of his volume in communities of scholarship interested in contemporary issues of race, colonialism and cosmopolitanism and how Kant's work can be received in these domains.

There is a second theoretical context into which Mikkelsen situates his selected texts, namely the history of the life sciences in the eighteenth century. Kant's relation to this history is a matter that has only recently come under serious reconsideration, after a century of work that has privileged his concern with Newtonian physics. Mikkelsen gives a good account of the state of this emergent historiography, especially in relation to Kant, and he recognizes that that research is still in its very early stages. Since this is the field of my own research interest, I am very pleased to see Mikkelsen's attentiveness to this question and his suggestions for further inquiry. But it will also be here that I will raise some specialist's quibbles.

It is altogether salutary that Mikkelsen included texts from Kant's contemporaries and situated the whole volume in the context of the emergent discourse in life sciences of the eighteenth century. Nevertheless, by virtue of his selection, organization, and explicit interpretative interventions, Mikkelsen has not altogether inadvertently given his volume a spin that suggests that the whole discourse arose in response to Kant. This Kant-centered conception, while certainly understandable in a volume entitled Kant and the Concept of Race, makes Kant appear to be the driving force in this field, whereas, in my view, he needs to be situated in a much wider course of developments that his specific interventions, to be sure, inflected but did not fundamentally direct. Thus, Mikkelsen might well have emphasized in his introduction, and even in his selection of texts, the more decisive figures in this emergent science. Buffon is of course central, and while Mikkelsen notes this, he does not raise in sufficient detail exactly what Kant took up from Buffon, why and when. The details of that reception, however, seem crucial to an appraisal of Kant's whole relation to the emergent life sciences. Similarly, path-breaking work by Caspar Friedrich Wolff and Johann Friedrich Blumenbach before Kant proved decisive for the German exploration of epigenesis, which Mikkelsen rightly singles out as crucial for Kant's views on the life sciences. Their textual inclusion, rather than brief mention in his introduction, might have relativized Kant's place in the discourse of the life sciences of his day. Of course, there are limits to what the volume could provide. That Mikkelsen includes an excerpt from the now forgotten, but at the time eminent, biogeographer Zimmermann is one of the most welcome features of his collection, though I do not believe Mikkelsen fully appreciates the importance of Zimmermann or the influence of his criticisms of Kant.

Even more important, in my view, is the question of Kant's rival, Johann Gottfried Herder, whose reception of Wolff and Blumenbach in his Ideas for a Philosophical History of Mankind (1784) drew a two-part review from Kant, perhaps the most hostile and disparaging commentary he published on another scholar. Mikkelsen excluded these from his collection, but they in fact deserve a very prominent place in it if we are to understand how Kant came to his ultimate positions. Many of the texts from 1785 onward reflect Kant's explicit critique of Herder and the reactions to it in the wider community of German life science, but the absence of his reviews (to say nothing of texts from Herder himself) obscures this connection. To be sure, again, the volume could not include everything, but my suggestion is that this is not a dispensable element in the story Mikkelsen proposed to reconstruct. He explicitly addresses his omission of Herder and tries, in his introductions to the later texts and in his annotations, to take cognizance of the Herder connection. However, I find these disappointingly superficial regarding Herder. Moreover, there are specific textual passages in Kant's reviews of Herder that are essential for a grasp of the later texts by Kant and the others, and which Mikkelsen could easily have appended or cited more extensively in his annotations. In a word, I find this the most salient historical weakness in Mikkelsen's work.

By contrast, the inclusion of the text from Meiners and the discussion of this figure in the apparatus of the volume represent a very important contribution to Anglophone understanding of the language of race in late eighteenth-century Germany. This is, I suggest, the most cutting-edge element in Mikkelsen's volume, bespeaking his principal concern with race theory. The relation between Meiners and Kant on questions of race has become a matter of increasing scholarly interest, and the possibility of mutual influence has now been put forward as demanding serious consideration. Having a particularly odious exemplar of Meiners' racism in English will make this issue more conspicuous still. This is important, especially in a current context where Meiners is receiving more favorable attention as a cultural anthropologist, but without an adequate recognition of his oppressively racist baggage. For Kant specialists and even more for a general philosophical readership interested in questions of race and cosmopolitanism, Mikkelsen's volume is a very welcome contribution.