Kant and the End of War: A Critique of Just War Theory

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Howard Williams, Kant and the End of War: A Critique of Just War Theory, Palgrave Macmillan, 2012, 216pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230244207.

Reviewed by Harry van der Linden, Butler University


Political theorist and Kant scholar Howard Williams argues in this slim volume (with seven chapters and a conclusion) that it is an error to place Kant in the just war tradition, as Brian Orend and Susan Shell recently have, and that he should instead be viewed as an important critic of this tradition. Williams holds that such conflicting understandings of Kant's view of the just war tradition can be explained by the fact that Kant appears to support the notion of just war in The Doctrine of Right, Part One of the Metaphysics of Morals, while he emphatically rejects just war theory in Perpetual Peace by describing its eminent proponents Grotius, Vattel, and Pufendorf as "sorry comforters." A main focus of Williams's book (covered in chapters 2-5) is to elaborate, explain, and, in the final instance, reconcile the divergent perspectives on the ethics of war in Perpetual Peace and the Metaphysics of Morals. In Williams's view the two perspectives are brought together since both works demand that we seek a legal order for the "end of war," implying that "the idea of just war belongs to an international system that is unjust overall [and] so the idea is thoroughly compromised" (112).

A second aim of Kant and the End of War (covered in chapter 6) is to show that Kant's very restrictive view of military intervention for the sake of the promotion of human rights is much more defensible than the highly permissible view of some contemporary "Kantians," such as Roger Scruton and Fernando Tesón, who favor intervention for democracy promotion or humanitarian intervention based on just war theory. A third and final aim (covered in chapter 7) is to demonstrate, and then criticize in Kantian terms, that contemporary just war theory, as exemplified by, among others, Michael Walzer, rests on "Hegelian premises," including, e.g., that the state is the proper focus of individual loyalty and that war is a permanent aspect of the state system.

In the first chapter, Williams offers an overview of Kant's thinking about war in his corpus at large. In many instances, Kant points to positive aspects of war, such as bravery and honor in war lifting us up above nature (instinctual self-preservation) and war leading people to explore all corners of the earth and create constitutional states. But Williams rightly argues that the good effects of war are only elements of historical progress and humanity's gradual maturation, to be superseded by (ethical action toward) perpetual peace. Failing to see the transitional positive aspects of war and being overwhelmed by its horrors, we might end up with lack of hope for the future and despair about the human condition. Similarly, "war" in metaphysics is to be overcome. The Critique of Pure Reason presents dogmatic philosophers as engaged in war-like debates and offers the critical method as the road toward peace (35-37).

In the second chapter, Williams states the problem of Kant's seemingly divergent assessment of just war theory in Perpetual Peace and The Metaphysics of MoralsPerpetual Peace's "Case against Just War Theory" is here summarized and then elaborated and assessed in the third chapter, while the "Case for Just War Theory" made in The Metaphysics of Morals is also summarized in the second chapter and then questioned in the fourth chapter. The fifth chapter, entitled "Bringing the Argument Together," also seeks to show continuity between the two works. This mode of exposition is not without problems because it might have contributed to Williams presenting Perpetual Peace as more opposed to the notion of just war than is warranted, even on his own account (as I argue below).

For Williams, the central passage of Kant's "Case against Just War Theory" in Perpetual Peace is his characterization of Grotius, Pufendorf, and Vattel as "sorry comforters" (in "Second Definite Article of a Perpetual Peace"). As Kant puts it, "their code" has no legal force (since the international order is a state of nature) and they "are always duly cited in justification of offensive war, though there is no instance of a state ever having being moved to desist from its plan by arguments armed with the testimony of such important men" (58). Williams ends the citation at this point, leaving out that Kant goes on to say that the

homage which every state pays (in words at least) to the concept of right proves that man possesses a greater moral capacity, still dormant at present, to overcome eventually the evil principle within him (for he cannot deny that it exists), and to hope that others will do likewise.

What are we to make of Kant's claims here? It seems clear that Kant held that it is doubtful that jus ad bellum principles actually influence rulers and that their reference to these principles might provide wars of aggression with the aura of justice. Still, Kant saw as a sign of hope that rulers thought they need to appeal to such principles in the first place because this reflects a human concern with morality that might awaken and lead to progress. Williams draws several other inferences, including that Kant held: that philosophers who provide just war counsel to rulers are "debasing themselves" (58), that philosophers instead should be critics of political and military leaders (59), that "Grotius, Pufendorf and Vattel were taking for granted the presence of war in international society . . . rather than questioning it and asking how it might be removed" (63), and that they "pride themselves on their acquaintance with the way of the world and contrast it with the presumed naivety of those who seek security without war" (64). In my view, Williams infers more here than is warranted by Kant textually, and his sharp denunciations of the just war tradition are stronger than is historically warranted or plausible.

According to Williams, Kant also held that just war theory is incoherent because he wrote in Perpetual Peace that "the concept of the right of nations as that of the right to go to war" implies that "it is quite right if human beings so disposed destroy one another and thus find perpetual peace in the vast grave that covers all the horrors of violence along with their authors" (65). If this indeed is Kant's argument, it is a weak one because the just war theorist can (and should) readily grant that an unconditional right to war leads to the perpetual peace of the graveyard. Surprisingly, Williams concludes that "Perpetual Peace dismisses the claims of traditional international law concerning justice before war (jus ad bellum) and justice in war (jus in bello)" (73). Williams provides no evidence for the claim that Kant was dismissive of the need to place legal constraints on the conduct of war, and Preliminary Article 6 suggests otherwise. The article stipulates that during times of war no acts should be permitted that "would make mutual confidence impossible during a future time of peace," mentioning such acts as assassination, the use of poison, instigation of treason among the enemy, and wars of "extermination." Kant clearly is recognizing the importance of jus in bello restrictions, and Williams shows little appreciation for how just war theory in the form of international humanitarian law has reduced at least some of the horrors of war.

Similarly, the Preliminary Articles show that in Perpetual Peace Kant did not reject the notion of a justly initiated war altogether. In Preliminary Article 3, for example, he objects to standing armies but approves of citizens voluntarily opting for military training "in order to secure themselves and their fatherland against attacks from outside." Moreover, Preliminary Article 5 rejects intervention in a state with a poor record of upholding the rights of its own citizens, but it allows that intervention is permissible when internal discord has led to two separate governments, each claiming authority over the whole country. Indeed, Williams grants the general point, concluding that once we incorporate the Preliminary Articles or Kant's comments on the "Guarantee of a Perpetual Peace" (in the First Supplement), the contrast between Perpetual Peace and The Metaphysics of Morals is not so sharp (89) and that in both works "Kant is both a highly limited advocate of war as a final, desperate step of self-defense and yet one of its sharpest critics" (90). What further supports this conclusion on Williams's account is that Kant's acceptance of the notion of just war in The Metaphysics of Morals is to be judged in light of the fact that this work ends with a condemnation of war and the imperative to seek a federation of states. Moreover, the logic of this academic work is to expose international law and then question it, and we should not confuse exposition with approval (85, 97). In sum, the continuity between the two works is that Kant, unlike traditional just war theorists, does not want to give political leaders the comfort of thinking that their wars are just: "For him war is always a suboptimal moral choice and he wants to see it become an illegal choice in the publicly recognized law of nations" (91).

In Chapter 6, Williams continues to contrast Kant and just war theory by arguing that "Kant's authority cannot be invoked for any programme of humanitarian intervention based on just war theory" (115). He first argues that Kant definitely rejects democracy promotion through military violence, and that Scruton distorts Kant by invoking his name in support of this idea and its application in the justification of the Iraq war of 2003. I share Williams's view that it is an error to place Kant in the camp of supporters of "democratic peace" through force, but it should be noted that many just war theorists also deny that promotion of "democratic peace" constitutes a just cause and were vocal critics of the Iraq war as well. However, many just war theorists have embraced humanitarian intervention, and here the contrast between Kant and just war may seem stronger. Williams goes on to criticize Tesón's "Kantian" just war theory justification of humanitarian intervention, arguing that he defends a "hyper-interventionism" (119) and displays a "missionary zeal" (135). Initially, it seems that Williams wants to argue that Kant's view implies that military humanitarian intervention should always be rejected (see 115). But he ends up by claiming that Preliminary Article 5 suggests that Kant might approve of intervention if a country suffers from a civil war and the absence of a clear sovereign power, while the intervention must also be requested by a party in support of the "federation of states" and be in accord with the will of the nations in support of this federation (133-35). Regrettably, Williams only mentions that "Kant's interventionist principle could not be deployed to underwrite the support offered to Franco by Fascist Italy and Germany in the 1930s" (133) and that it puts into question Jürgen Habermas's support of the Kosovo intervention (135). Notably, he leaves out important test cases such as Cambodia, Rwanda, and Libya.

Williams's attempt to articulate a Kantian interventionist principle shows that he is doing what just war theorists seek to do: articulate conditions of just initiation of war. The recent record of humanitarian intervention seems to some extent supportive of Williams's contention that we should follow Kant in being "extremely cautious" with regard to approving such interventions, but, then, some just war theorists are also much less permissive in this regard than others. In fact, just war theory consists of many theories, some more bellicose and others moving more closely to pacifism, and Williams has a tendency to equate typically more bellicose modes of just war thinking that he rejects with just war theory as such.

This objection may also be launched against Williams's argument in chapter 7 that contemporary just war theory rests on Hegelian premises. He asserts that "contemporary just war theorists . . . may not all say with Hegel that 'the higher significance of war is that through it' the 'ethical health of nations is preserved' but they do indicate that war has its part to play in the normality of international relations." And they share with Hegel "the recognition and acceptance of the state as the prime focus for the political loyalty of individuals" (143). More specifically, Williams discusses the works of Walzer, Jean Bethke Elshtain, James Turner Johnson, and John Rawls, and finds their just war thinking Hegelian in nature, albeit Rawls to a lesser degree. Williams's synoptic analyses of their works are interesting and have merit, but it also should be said that many contemporary just war theorists have contested especially Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars and its "statist" focus. Some just war theorists view human rights protection as the normative foundation of just wars; others have addressed the legitimate authority of non-state actors and international bodies, discussed the emergence of new types of conflicts, etc.

In short, Williams fails to do justice to the richness and diversity of contemporary just war theory. Still, the "end of war" is an important Kantian imperative that is too often overlooked. This is an error on just war theory's own jus ad bellum terms. After all, how can any given war be designated as a last resort measure if we do not continuously seek to realize the conditions of perpetual peace? Accordingly, we should applaud that a just war theorist very recently has proposed to add "jus in abolitione belli" as a new category to just war theory. This category is not concerned with how or when to use force but rather with the "appropriate means to bring about the abolition of war."[1]

[1] See Steven P. Lee, Ethics and War (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012), 300. In my own writings, I have argued that just war theory needs to be supplemented by criteria of just military preparedness (jus ante bellum). See, for example, my "From Hiroshima to Baghdad: Military Hegemony versus Just Military Preparedness," in Philosophy after Hiroshima, ed. Edward Demenchonok (Newcastle, UK: Cambridge Scholars Press, 2010). In both these additions to just war theory, attention is paid to the unjust global institutional context of wars and how changes in this context can reduce the occurrence of war.