Kant and the Faculty of Feeling

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Kelly Sorensen and Diane Williamson (eds.), Kant and the Faculty of Feeling, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 276pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107178229.

Reviewed by Tim Jankowiak, Towson University


This excellent volume marks an important contribution to the growing body of literature on Kant's heretofore underappreciated account of the "faculty of feeling." The essays address a wide range of topics related to Kant's systematic account of the structure of mind, the relevance of feeling to moral cognition, aesthetic experience, and the points of contact between theoretical and practical philosophy. The book will be rewarding for anyone concerned with any of these issues. Before jumping into my remarks about the individual contributions to the volume, I'll do a little stage-setting.

Kant divides the mind into three main faculties: cognition, desire, and feeling. Each of these faculties is characterized first and foremost in terms of the kinds of representations they generate. Cognition generates representations of objects (how things are). Desire generates representations aimed at making their objects actual (how things ought to be). And feeling generates pleasurable and displeasurable representations (how things are for me). All three faculties are further subdivided into higher and lower forms, with the higher manifestations of the faculties spontaneously generating a priori representations, and the lower enabling passively received empirical representations. Thus, the faculty of cognition has a priori and empirical representations of objects (space, time, and the categories on the one hand, and sensory representations on the other), and the faculty of desire has a priori aims and empirical aims (promotion of the morally good on the one hand, and promotion of our own happiness on the other). The faculty of feeling is a bit more complicated (as this volume's essays make clear), but it seems at least that the pleasurable feelings of the beautiful and sublime, scientific discovery, moral respect, and possibly even Kantian hope have an a priori basis, while the more mundane sensuous pleasures of the body are empirical.

The faculty of feeling has always been the least discussed of the three faculties. The faculty of cognition is usually taken to be the centerpiece of Kant's philosophical system, and he devotes most of Critique of Pure Reason to the project of mapping it out. Critique of Practical Reason also deals with cognition (in its practical manifestation), but insofar as practical cognition generates a recognition of the moral law, which sets the promotion of the good as a necessary end for rational agents, this text can be considered Kant's primary account of the faculty of desire (at least in its a priori manifestation). It would then be tempting to look to the Critique of Judgment for Kant's account of the faculty of feeling. While there is definitely something to this suggestion (as Patrick Frierson shows; see below), the faculty of feeling receives no detailed, systematic discussion in that text. Moreover, while the Third Critique does address the pleasurable feelings associated with the beautiful, the sublime, and the teleologically systematic, there are other important feelings that are not discussed there at all.

The situation is thus that Kant gives only a piecemeal account of the faculty of feeling, spread across several different major and minor writings. The absence of any focused, systematic account of the faculty of feeling in Kant's major, critical period works, goes a long way towards explaining why it has received relatively little attention in the literature. Another reason (one which is successfully undermined by several essays in this book) why the faculty of feeling receives the least attention is because of the natural (albeit misguided) assumption that the capacity for pleasure and displeasure relates exclusively to our animal nature, and that Kant's concern with the noble, rational, human part of the mind warrants much greater attention.

Whatever the reasons for the disproportionate lack of attention paid to the faculty of feeling, it seems clear that one cannot claim to have a complete, systematic account of the Kantian mind without thinking through the functions of all three faculties, together with their interdependent relations to each other. This commendable volume succeeds in making the case that Kant's account of the faculty of feeling has deep and illuminating systematic connections to the more well-known aspects of his philosophical system. In what follows, I'll try to give a sense of what I take to be most interesting and important about the contributions to the volume. I'll divide the discussion into two main parts. First, I'll consider the essays that address systematic considerations regarding feeling's place in the Kantian system. Then, I'll consider those that deal with the specific relations between feeling and morality.

Systematic Considerations

As noted above, Kant divides the mind into three faculties: cognition, desire, and feeling. The faculty of feeling seems to have been the last to receive Kant's close attention, and it seems that early on he was not confident that there was much to say about it within the context of a priori philosophy at all. For feeling is the part of the mind that generates pleasurable and painful mental states, and it would be natural to think that matters of pleasure and pain pertain to our animal, empirical nature. Frierson ("'A new sort of a priori principles': Psychological Taxonomies and the Origin of the Third Critique") argues that it was Kant's late recognition that there are a priori principles of feeling that initially inspired him to write a third critique. The insight was that there is a parallel between two tripartite distinctions in the Kantian mind. In addition to the tripartite distinction of cognition, desire, and feeling, there is also the division of cognition (in its "higher" manifestation) into understanding, reason, and judgment. Frierson argues that Kant discovered that he could line these two distinctions up: analyzing understanding and reason revealed the principles of cognition and desire (respectively). The Third Critique's account of the pleasures produced by reflective judgment's activity should be seen as a completion of this systematic correspondence.

Kristi Sweet ("Between Cognition and Morality: Pleasure as 'Transition' in Kant's Critical System") also addresses systematic concerns regarding feeling's place in relation to the other mental faculties. Her main concern is to show how the Third Critique's account of feeling in relation to the power of judgment was necessary for avoiding an unacceptably dualistic schism between the theoretical and practical sides of the human mind. She wants to avoid a picture in which the mind is "split between two worlds" (132) and is "simply an aggregate of cognitive functions" (134). She argues that the practical and theoretical sides of the mind are fully heterogeneous in relation to each other, and that Kant recognized the need for some third power that could mediate between them. Sweet makes the case that reflective judgment's pleasure in the beautiful can play this transitional role because it is partly homologous with the two other faculties.

In a different vein, Alix Cohen ("Rational Feelings") also addresses the way in which the faculty of feeling stands astride the theoretical and the practical. The most important feeling in Kant's system is moral respect, and this makes it clear that there are tight connections between feeling and practical reason. But does feeling have a contribution to make on the theoretical side of things? Cohen persuasively makes the case that the pleasure accompanying scientific discovery is a theoretical analogue of the practical feeling of moral respect. Kant often defines pleasure as a representation of the promotion of life activity (pain is the representation of its hindrance). Since cognition aimed at systematic understanding of the world is one of the essential activities of the living human subject, it is natural that success in this sort of project would feel good, and that this feeling would prod us towards further systematic investigation. Cohen argues that the analogy between this pleasure and moral respect runs deep: both are produced by pure reason, and both provide a special kind of "subjective ground of activity" (19).

Like Sweet, Janelle DeWitt ("Feeling and Inclination: Rationalizing the Animal Within") and Allen W. Wood ("Feeling and Desire in the Human Animal") are also concerned with a troubling dualism in the Kantian mind. Here's a caricature of Kant's view that is often, unfortunately, taken as official doctrine: The human being is a composite of a pure, rational, noble, self-legislating agent on the one hand, and a base, heteronomous, instinct-driven animal on the other. Cognition resides in the former, feeling in the latter, and the two fight over desire. The proper task of the right-minded human being is to wrest control from the animal self and let proud reason dictate all action. In addition to being ridiculously prudish, this caricature is problematic insofar as it presents the self as deeply fractured.

Neither DeWitt nor Wood think that this popular caricature describes Kant's actual position. DeWitt attempts to undermine this picture by defending a cognitivist account of Kantian feeling: feelings are (often, at least) rational. One important motivation for her view is the observation that feeling is a kind of practical receptivity. On the theoretical side of things, the receptive faculty of sensibility is not purely animal and passive, but is instead determined by the spontaneous activity of understanding, which gives structure to the forms of space and time. In this sense, sensibility is partly rational, and thus there's reason to assume that Kantian feeling would be partly rational as well.

Wood takes the idea even further. His basic point is that the human being is an animal, that to be human is to be rational, and thus that "the human inner animal is already a rational animal -- 'all the way down'" (93). One main takeaway of this rewarding essay is that we can get rid of the conception of Kantian moral motivation in terms of "a supernatural lightning bolt descending upon our animal nature from out of the intelligible world" (103). In general, both DeWitt and Wood successfully make the case that Kant's view is much more plausible and nuanced than it's often made out to be. The self is not at war with itself, and feelings are not foreign aliens trespassing on reason's territory.

Feeling and Morality

While several of the essays discussed above make it clear that the faculty of feeling has important connections to Kant's theoretical philosophy, he devotes much more attention to feeling's importance on the practical side of things. We'll see below that Kant is sometimes ambivalent about this connection, but there is one feeling that is consistently celebrated in Kant's moral theory, viz., the feeling of moral respect. Moral respect is the focus of Diane Williamson's "Respect, in Every Respect," and Jeanine M. Grenberg's "The Practical, Cognitive Import of Feeling: A Phenomenological Account." Williamson considers the frequently discussed question whether the proper object of respect is the moral law itself, or instead the human beings who instantiate it. Her answer is that the two options amount to the same thing: "rational being has absolute and inherent value, just like morality itself, and rational being is therefore itself a sublime object" (237). Along the way, she details the interesting suggestion that there is a correspondence between the four "affective preconditions of morality" (moral feeling, conscience, love, and self-esteem, which she takes to be four distinct modes of respect) and the four types of moral obligations (positive and negative obligations to self and to others). While these correspondence claims are presented somewhat tentatively, the suggestion strikes me as worthy of further investigation.

Grenberg considers a very different question about respect. She aims to give a phenomenological account of this feeling, and thereby to further clarify its importance in moral cognition. The essay is centered around the worry that moral respect, as a feeling experienced in time, must be an empirical experience of the self from a third-person perspective (the self as object). This would be problematic because moral respect is supposed to reveal something about the self as subject, i.e., as intelligible autonomous rational agent self-determined by the moral law. The worry is that no empirical experience could yield access to such an intelligible self. Grenberg solves this problem by arguing that the feeling of moral respect is a non-intuitive determination of time, representing no object at all, and is "instead a phenomenological experience that reveals . . . a trace or hint of one's own intelligible and legislating subject" (50).

Another peculiar mental state that Kant often celebrates in a moral context is hope, which Rachel Zuckert ("Is Kantian Hope a Feeling?") argues should indeed be conceived as a feeling (as opposed to a mere cognitive attitude similar to belief). Kant famously says that one of the three basic questions of philosophy is, "What may I hope?" Although he never quite answers this question directly, it's clear that he thinks that we may hope that there is a moral deity who rewards virtue, that we are immortal, and that nature is comprehensible by minds like ours. Zuckert is most concerned about the relation between reason and hope, most especially in the context of Kant's moral proof of God's existence. She argues persuasively that it would be a mistake to think that reason generates hope. Rather, reason's job is to give content to hope by way of limiting hope and thereby provide it rational justification.

I mentioned above that Kant is frequently ambivalent about feeling's role in moral cognition. Wiebke Deimling ("Two Different Kinds of Value? Kant on Feeling and Moral Cognition") considers this issue in some detail. On the one hand, she argues, emotions are at best highly suspect as sources of motivation. But on the other, Kant praises feelings like respect, love, and sympathy as necessary for morality. Moreover, both feeling and practical cognition aim to "track value" (37). But they do not track the same values (feeling is directed towards life-activity, practical cognition towards the good). She concludes that, despite their different fundamental aims, certain morally relevant feelings do have important work to play in supporting moral cognition.

This ambivalence is a recurring theme in a couple of essays from later in the volume. Robert R. Clewis addresses "The Feeling of Enthusiasm," which Kant not-so-illuminatingly defines as "the idea of the good with affect." Clewis manages to flesh out this skeletal account in some helpful ways. Kant's "enthusiasm," it should be noted, has a very different connotation than the word has in contemporary English. For Kant, it has a distinctly moral content, and seems to be something like a vivid imagining of a concrete instantiation of the good, which one then strives to make actual. Kant's ambivalence towards feeling is certainly present in his account of enthusiasm. For on the one hand, enthusiasm can function as a motivational force that can lead one to great and noble deeds. But on the other, it is both non-rational and liable to error, and thus if one lets oneself be overwhelmed by a misguided enthusiasm, one could lapse into zealotry.

Kelly Sorensen discusses "Sympathy, Love, and the Faculty of Feeling." I found this to be a good defense of Kant's antipathy towards common manifestations of sympathy and love, which we usually celebrate as some of the best human emotions. One problem with common forms of sympathy is that they don't accurately track what ought to be morally salient. For instance, we might sympathize with a friend who got caught having an affair. More importantly, though, sympathy (and love) often reflect attitudes of power and superiority over others: it's often condescending and self-congratulatory. Sympathy can be especially problematic insofar as the sympathetic smile can "hide those corrupt attitudes" (210). One thinks here of the kind of person who will claim to sincerely feel bad about the plight of refugees, yet still insist that they ought to seek shelter anywhere but here. Nevertheless, Kant still thinks that sympathy does have a positive role to play, especially in young people: before reason is fully developed, it can provide incentive towards moral action. Moreover, even though it is not a perfect "good-detector," sympathy can often color our perception of the world so as to make us more sensitive to the suffering of others.

Lastly, there are two essays dealing with the aesthetic feelings of the beautiful and sublime, both of which are important for Kant insofar as they function to make us aware of our moral vocation. Paul Guyer ("What is it Like to Experience the Beautiful and Sublime?") is concerned with the broad question of how exactly pleasure and pain should be defined in Kant's system. The debate, as he sees it, is between a phenomenological model of pleasure and a dispositional model (he argues for the second option). He argues that the phenomenological model would (oddly) treat all pleasures as alike and all pains as alike. Most importantly, a phenomenological model would not allow for an adequate distinction between the peculiarly painfully pleasurable experience of the sublime and other painful pleasures. By contrast, a functional or "dispositional" account of pleasure as any state that disposes one to stay in that state would not entail that every pleasure must feel the same.

Katerina Deligiori ("How to Feel a Judgment: The Sublime and its Architectonic Significance") is concerned with the broader systematic importance of the section on the sublime in the Third Critique. She argues that the brevity of this short section belies its full importance for Kant's account of moral self-knowledge. The experience of the sublime is a complicated feeling that involves, first, a kind of mild terror at the recognition that something is so large or powerful that we can't adequately grasp it conceptually, and then second, a kind of exalted pleasure at the recognition that there is something in our own nature -- reason -- that is itself superior to anything encountered in nature. The intentional structure of the experience of the sublime, she argues, is complicated: it's at once elicited by a terrifying object in nature, but its true intentional object is the experience of the subject itself. Ultimately though, the reason why the feeling of the sublime is so important is that it yields a gripping awareness of our own rational natures, which in turn serves as a reminder of our moral vocation.

All in all, the essays are for the most part of a high quality. The volume fills an important niche in the literature, and makes it clear that a close investigation of Kant's theory of the faculty of feeling is necessary for a full appreciation of both Kant's account of the structure of the human mind, and his moral psychology. I highly recommend the book to anyone working on these aspects of Kant's thought.