Kant and the Historical Turn: Philosophy as Critical Interpretation

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Karl Ameriks, Kant and the Historical Turn: Philosophy as Critical Interpretation, Oxford University Press, 2006, 335pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199205345.

Reviewed by Peter Thielke , Pomona College


The history of science is largely irrelevant to its contemporary practice, while the history of literature is an essential feature of the modern study of the field, but what precisely is -- or should be -- the relation between philosophy and its history?  This is the central question that Karl Ameriks poses in his marvelously rich new book, Kant and the Historical Turn, and the answer to it serves as the guiding thread that links the work's thirteen essays.  For Ameriks, the question of the role of the past in the contemporary practice of philosophy is no idle matter; rather, he suggests that it stands as the central problem that philosophy as a whole must answer.  Part of what makes Kant and the Historical Turn so interesting, then, is that the solution it proposes calls for a thoroughgoing reconception of what the practice of philosophy ought to involve.

This might at first glance seem like an outlandish claim, since the book is ostensibly focused on a relatively narrow range of historical topics dealing with Kant and the Idealists who followed him.  But, as Ameriks persuasively argues, the issues that arise in assessing Kant's position quickly lead to the broader topic of how philosophy must come to grips with its past, and this in turn points, Ameriks thinks, to a crucial dilemma facing the discipline.  On the one hand, philosophy can be taken to be a kind of transcendent project, devoted to solving the core problems of existence in a way that makes little reference to historical circumstance; on this approach, philosophy seeks "indubitable first truths" (1) that lay claim to a timeless conception of reason.  On the other hand, an acknowledgement of the various developments that give rise to particular schools of thought can lead to a thoroughgoing historicist view of philosophy, in which each age expresses "the thought of its own distinctive era" (2).  For the historicist position, philosophy is not inexorably leading to the discovery of some eternal truths, but rather reflects a multitude of often antagonistic perspectives and insights that characterize the history of thought.

Casting the different conceptions of philosophy in this way underscores the relevance of Ameriks' topic, since, as he suggests, the first, ahistorical view is usually taken to culminate in Kant, while the second, historicist position is traditionally located in the post-Kantian movements begun by Schelling and Hegel (3).  Neither of these two conceptions of philosophy is baseless, of course, but as Ameriks notes, each suffers from a serious problem.  The idea that philosophy is engaged in a timeless rational project either must ignore what seem to be obvious divergences of views about central questions in metaphysics and morals, or threatens to devolve into a pernicious form of dogmatism.  The historicist view, however, teeters on the precipice of a thoroughgoing relativism, in which the expressions of one particular epoch remain remote from -- and yet as equally valid as -- any other age.  

As befits a good Kantian, Ameriks seeks a middle way between these two opposed extremes, and this project forms the core of Kant and the Historical Turn.  Its subtitle -- 'Philosophy as Critical Interpretation' -- provides a hint of Ameriks' strategy, which seeks to develop an essentially hermeneutical approach to philosophy.  On this line of thought, historicist relativism gives way to "a more complex and moderate invocation of historical considerations, a 'historical turn' that involves drastically modifying philosophy with respect to the style of its expression while still leaving room for a permanent and non-relative value in many of its systematic claims" (6).  For Ameriks, the crucial task of philosophy is to somehow reconcile the demands of historicity and systematicity, and it is this goal that drives Kant and the Historical Turn.

Aside from a new introductory essay that develops the hermeneutical theme, the other chapters are all drawn from previously published pieces.  The book is divided into four sections, the first of which focuses primarily on Kant, the second on the pivotal role in the historical turn that Ameriks attributes to K.L. Reinhold, the third on the Idealist movement after Kant, and the fourth -- and most provocative -- on some contemporary interpretations of Kant and the history of philosophy.

Although the guiding thread of the work is found in the notion of a hermeneutical approach to philosophy, this emerges as an explicit theme only in the first of the six essays on Kant, 'Text and Context.'  Here, the central challenge in interpreting Kant is to strike a proper balance between the historical and the 'systematic,' but fulfilling this task will reveal that Kant's system "has an ever relevant potential, and that the significance of its main doctrines can be no more fixed in place than the significance of the best recent, and still controversial, ideas of contemporary philosophers" (37).  This sentiment carries through to the rest of the essays on Kant.  Chapters on Kant's account of apperception, on the difference between his and Berkeley's idealism, on Hume's and Kant's accounts of moral motivation, on the perhaps surprising similarities between Kant and Reid, and on the Transcendental Dialectic of the first Critique all develop, in Ameriks' clear and elegant fashion, a conception of Kant's thought that is intended, I suspect, to indirectly demonstrate its relevance for contemporary philosophy.  Throughout, two related themes characterize Ameriks' reading of Kant: first, an emphasis on the detailed arguments for the transcendental ideality of space and time; and second, a focus on the metaphysical aspects of Kant's project, in particular the centrality of autonomy and freedom.  As Ameriks notes, for Kant the possibility -- although not the theoretical proof -- of autonomy and freedom crucially rests on the ideality of space and time, since this opens up the conceptual space for a conception of the self that is not wholly determined by the laws of nature. 

The method that Ameriks takes Kant to be employing in establishing these results can perhaps best be described as 'regressive': as Ameriks reads him, Kant begins with certain assumptions about the common sense nature of our experience, and then 'regressively' asks about what transcendental conditions make this experience possible.  Kant recognizes that any attempt to justify common sense is "not only unneeded but also doomed" (116), and from the beginning, Kant gives voice "to the common thought that we take for granted that there is reality, simply speaking, and that we are dependent on rather than creative of it" (128).  One consequence of this reading, however, is that the issue of skepticism recedes in importance, to the point, in fact, that the problems raised by skeptical critics of Kant get very little mention.  Given Ameriks' suspicions of many Anglophone interpreters who border on the obsessive about a 'Kantian answer' to the problem of Cartesian or Humean skepticism, this is perhaps not surprising, and Ameriks is right that the anti-skeptical dimension to Kant's thought is often accorded too much weight.  But given Ameriks' own hermeneutical approach, it would seem that the skeptical retorts to Kant, especially those of his contemporaries such as Maimon and Aenesidemus-Schulze, would warrant more discussion.  Maimon in particular seems especially relevant, since his attacks on Kant largely center on his concerns about just the sort of 'regressive' argument that Ameriks attributes to the Critical Philosophy. 

The various essays on Kant are all models of philosophical lucidity, but perhaps the most interesting part of the book lies in its final three sections, where Ameriks addresses some figures and themes that are relatively unknown to Anglophone readers.  This is particularly the case with the two essays on Reinhold, which reveal a far more subtle and interesting historically minded position than the foundationalism that is usually associated with Reinhold -- when he is even considered at all.  In fact, as Ameriks argues, it is with Reinhold that the historical turn truly begins, since in his early efforts to popularize Kant, Reinhold had to come to terms with how a philosophical position expresses -- in a phrase presaging Hegel -- the 'spirit of its age.'  The difficult task of presenting Kant's position to a wider public led Reinhold to develop a philosophical project that is rooted "in a constant and explicit attempt to confront the chaotic character of philosophy as a historical enterprise" (194).  Keeping this in mind, Ameriks argues, allows for a robust defense of Reinhold against Hegel's charge that he both abstracts from the details of philosophy while at the same time remaining blind to the real truths that Hegel himself presumably reveals (197).  As Ameriks presents the case, it is Hegel, and not Reinhold, who is guilty of a kind of extreme dogmatism about an inexorable dialectical process, one that stands at odds with Reinhold's more plausibly moderate appreciation of the need for philosophy to appreciate its lineages.

Despite the strong case Ameriks makes for Reinhold's historical sensitivities, however, the relation between this facet of his thought and his central 'Principle of Consciousness' remains a bit unclear.  As Reinhold conceived it, the Principle would provide an indubitable ground for the Kantian system, by stating the fundamental nature of consciousness, in which subject and object are related by the mediating term of 'representation.'  But Reinhold's motives for introducing this foundational claim arise not only from concerns about the historically situated nature of thought, but also from a worry about the skeptical challenges faced by Kant's transcendental idealism.  Indeed, Ameriks himself perhaps inadvertently suggests just this point when in a later essay he remarks that Reinhold and Fichte "were espousing a strong foundationalist program for philosophy that would supposedly bring skepticism to rest forever and rebuild thought and the world on a totally rationalist basis" (217).  Of course, Reinhold's foundationalism need not be incompatible with an emphasis on the history of thought, and I suspect that Ameriks wants to rescue Reinhold from the clutches of those who see him simply as a foil to Fichte and Hegel.  But while the historical dimension to Reinhold's thought leads us a good way in that direction, it would be helpful to see in more detail how Reinhold attempts to reconcile the historical developments of thought with his avowed foundational Principle of Consciousness, and how this stands in relation to the skeptical challenges raised against Kant.

The essays on Reinhold are followed by two more on the Hegelian aftermath, one on Hegel's aesthetics and its response to Kant and Romanticism, and the other on Feuerbach, Marx, and Kierkegaard.  In the former, Ameriks draws an important and exceedingly helpful distinction between two different types of Romanticism that developed in Kant's wake: a later form associated with von Savigny and the later Friedrich Schlegel, and an earlier version found in Novalis, Schleiermacher and others in the Jena school.  While Hegel and the later Romantics misunderstood Kant's aesthetic as an essentially subjectivist position, the earlier Romantics appreciated the objective element in Kant's thought, although with the qualification that the drive for systematicity that characterizes Kant's project must be tempered by the transformation of Kant's "heavy prose into 'philosophical poetry'" (216).  While the Romantics are often taken to be opposed to the Critical Philosophy, Ameriks makes the excellent case that the early Romantics were in concert with Kant in seeking a philosophy of a "broadly aesthetic kind" (226).  Against Hegel, then, the Kantian/early Romantic position offered a 'modest' understanding of the capacities of philosophy, one in which "the general methodology of great philosophy is not all that different from art" (226).  The essay on Feuerbach, Marx, and Kierkegaard makes the eminently plausible claim that while each of these thinkers ostensibly aligned himself against German Idealism, one of the great strengths of the earlier movement is that "so many of its ideas remain incorporated in the work of even its most vocal opponents" (232).  Both Feuerbach's and Marx's attempts to naturalize Hegel reveal that the 'guiding spirit' of Hegelian dialectic has a "tenacious legacy": Marx, for instance, like Hegel, "is committed to something that is much more than 'mere nature'" (243).  Even Kierkegaard -- despite his avowed antipathy to Hegel -- ends up with views about freedom and God that "uncannily correspond" to the later Schelling, and which point to the rejection of Hegelian rationalism encapsulated in Kierkegaard's famous 'leap of faith' (252).  

In the final section, Ameriks turns to contemporary approaches to interpreting the history of German Idealism, and here the guiding hermeneutical thread returns to the surface.  In three essays -- one a short review piece defending Kant's 'objective' credentials against worries raised in Frederick Beiser's Overcoming Subjectivity, another on the role of Selbstgefühl [self-awareness or self-feeling] in the aesthetic and historical turn in philosophy, and a concluding appraisal of Dieter Henrich's 'Konstellation' project, which seeks to describe the various 'constellations' of philosophical and historical connections amongst the various figures in Jena of the 1790s and 1800s -- Ameriks plumbs the depths of the prospects of a hermeneutical philosophical project, and what he reveals is of enormous interest.

While all three of these final essays are addressed to the problem of the way in which history informs philosophy, the second, concerning Manfred Frank's work on Selbstgefühl, is perhaps the richest statement of Ameriks' position.  Here Ameriks examines the way in which the historical turn is accompanied by a growing appreciation of the aesthetic dimension of philosophy.  The key reasons for both of these revolutions come in the recognition of the two central "stumbling blocks for contemporary forms of philosophical materialism … sentience and sapience, or the mysterious phenomena of qualia and intentionality" (273).  The 'subjective' is not simply the incidental dross left over from a wholly objective or 'scientific' view of the world, but rather expresses

the inside aspect of experience in general, our fundamental capacity to have feeling and style at all.  And think of the 'aesthetic' not as what is artistic in some very narrow sense, but as simply all the higher intentional and creative developments of subjectivity, considered apart from any privileging of other more easily demarcated projects such as science ('the mathematical'), ethics (including 'the political') or religion.  (285) 

This does not mean, as Ameriks is careful to note, that philosophy devolves into a mere aesthetic exercise, but rather that its systematic aims must be channeled through an appreciation of its fundamental historical and aesthetic elements: there is "an easily understandable reciprocal relation between grasping the distinctive content of human conceptual history and taking account of how it is permeated by the depth of subjectivity" (285).  And, this sets up the challenge for a genuinely Critical philosophy, one that steers a course between relativism and dogmatism, and that maintains Kant's "non-relativist and non-historicist systematic vision" while "including an honest but non excessive appreciation for post-Kantian and Romantic insights about the fragmentary and necessarily limited capacities of philosophy and thought in general" (284).

This is an inspiring vision, but the perplexing feature of this middle course centers on specifying exactly what it involves, and how precisely it occupies the precarious ground between dogmatism and relativism.  Ameriks recognizes this worry -- indeed, it is "hard to give a positive definition of exactly what makes an approach aesthetic in this sense" (283) -- and it is for this reason, I think, that while the central theme of the book is ostensibly about the historical turn, the reason why this issue is often in the background is that the essays themselves are taken to be examples of the approach Ameriks endorses.  That is, there is no algorithm, no necessary and sufficient conditions that allow one to definitively recognize that one is properly engaging with the history of philosophy.  Rather, there are examples of how this is to be done, and in this sense, the work as a whole is, I take it, intended as a kind of case study of the way in which a suitably hermeneutical philosophy is to be carried out.

In this broadly 'exemplary' method one can perhaps find an echo of the generally 'regressive' approach Ameriks employs in his interpretation of Kant: like the reading of the Critical Philosophy, the hermeneutical project begins with certain common-sensical premises and assumptions about the nature of philosophical inquiry and progress.  But, as with the regressive reading of Kant, Ameriks' hermeneutical approach to philosophy itself seems vulnerable to skeptical challenge.  Indeed, while the skeptic and the relativist might be taken to naturally complement each other, it's important to note that the skeptic can also be allied with the dogmatist -- why, the scientifically-minded opponent might ask, should we lay such weight on the aesthetic dimension of philosophy?  If one accepts that such a dimension is of crucial importance, then the regressive strategy works smoothly, but it's not clear what, if anything, can be said in favor of the central premises on which the hermeutical approach rests.  I entirely agree that the list of exemplary scholars that Ameriks cites -- Sellars, Kuhn, Rawls, Williams, MacIntyre, Taylor, Rorty, Cavell, Brandom, Friedman (283) (and, I would add, Ameriks himself) -- presents some of the very best work done in philosophy, but it's not entirely clear what the advocate of the hermeneutical approach could say to the opponent who questions the power or force of such examples.  More broadly, Ameriks' position does not so much secure the middle ground between relativism and dogmatism as it assumes that it exists.

At the risk of being too glib, I would say that Ameriks' approach to philosophical interpretation dovetails nicely with Kant's claims about the activity of judgment: it is matter of 'mother wit,' which cannot be taught by rote, but which rather can be gained only through practice.  To take the aesthetic and historical turns then is to appreciate that philosophy is

largely a matter of convincing without the sufficiency of these [analytic] means, let alone anything like scientific or logical closure.  Philosophical achievement thus has become, in large part, a matter of manifesting an argumentatively persuasive style, that is a relatively aesthetic, rather than a clearly 'demonstrative,' superiority over a large range of its competitors.  (283) 

Of course, this emphasis on the essentially judgmental nature of exegesis and argument need not be a unique characteristic of the study of the history of philosophy.  Learning to make a good argument in any area of thought, as the budding philosopher quickly realizes, is a matter that requires a great deal of practice: one must be attuned to the subtleties of an issue before one can argue compellingly for some conclusion or other, and an appreciation of these subtleties cannot itself be something that is a matter of rote.  Yet this expansion of the scope of mother wit to the philosophical project as a whole is, in a deeper sense, a vindication of Ameriks' view.  For a practice must be guided by an appreciation of its provenance; philosophy, unlike the sciences, is not just a method of thought, but also requires a sense of the way in which its distinctive issues have developed over time.  This, I take it, is the crucial core of the hermeneutical position, and one of the hopes that arises from reading Ameriks' enormously rewarding new book is that this call to endorse the historical turn will be heard far beyond those already working in the history of philosophy.