Kant and the Question of Theology

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Chris L. Firestone, Nathan A. Jacobs, and James H. Joiner (eds.), Kant and the Question of Theology, Cambridge University Press, 2017, pp.260, $99.99, ISBN 9781107116818.

Reviewed by Stephen R. Palmquist, Hong Kong Baptist University/Sogang University


This collection of twelve essays on various themes relating to Kant's theology and theory of religion is the latest contribution to a welcome trend in Kant-scholarship that has been steadily increasing for 25 years: to treat Kant's philosophical theology as seriously as Kant himself treated it. Before 1993 the number of books on this theme each decade could be counted on one hand; since the mid-1990s, multiple books have appeared each year. Chris L. Firestone and Nathan A. Jacobs have contributed significantly to this trend during the past twelve years, (co-)producing four volumes since 2006. The editors thus portray the trend as having significantly increased after Firestone and Jacobs 2008 (hereafter IDKR) appeared: IDKR "led to a new flood of publications focused on Kant's Religion" -- the number of relevant books published after IDKR supposedly being "similar" to "the entire period between 1970 and 2008" (p.4). However, their extravagant claim is dubious: two of the ten titles they cite from the post-2008 period are on unrelated topics; another one they list twice, using different titles. Still, their list does confirm that interest in Kant's theory of religion has at least remained stable since IDKR.

The title leaves readers guessing as to this volume's distinctive contribution to this now well-established trend. The Introduction's first paragraph lists not one but seven questions concerning Kant's philosophical theology. This accurately reflects the book's multi-faceted emphasis: its three parts, each with four chapters, deal with Kant's views on God, religion, and redemption, respectively. Before summarizing each chapter, the editors explain the book's aim. In the 1980s several analytic philosophers raised various "conundrums" relating to Kantian theology; in response, IDKR defended the coherence of Kant 2009 (hereafter RBBR). (Many writers before IDKR had defended the coherence of Kant's position, but none had done so in direct dialogue with these specific, analytically-inspired perplexities.) The editors, however, lament "the absence of the analytic voice since the 2008 turn to Religion" (p.6); they therefore intentionally include contributions by several prominent analytic philosophers. As a result of this emphasis, ironically, this book shows that IDKR's valiant effort to dispel the so-called "conundrums" largely fell on deaf ears. Few (if any) post-2008 works on RBBR have affirmed IDKR's arguments, because the conundrums trouble only those who accept the mono-perspectival biases of analytic philosophy; but this volume provides ample evidence that the same conundrums remain alive and well for analytic philosophers -- despite IDKR's good efforts to "turn" the world away from them in 2008. Let us now briefly examine each chapter's claims.

1. James DiCenso's masterful "Practical Cognition of God" begins by surveying "Kant's efforts to demarcate a legitimate moral application of theological concepts" (p.14). After explaining the limits Kant places on speculative cognition, he highlights the regulative significance of the ideas of reason, then shows how this use becomes practical when it is "exercised in context or manifested in concreto" (p.24) -- a feature I have called its "analytic a posteriori" status.[1] Carefully grounded in numerous quotations from Kant's texts, this overview would make excellent reading for students or scholars who are new to Kant's distinctive form of theological questioning, though a sharper contrast between practical cognition and its empirical/theoretical counterpart would have been helpful.

2. Carefully examining the theological implications of the last proposition in Kant's Idea for a Universal History (1784), Pablo Muchnik's "The Birth of God and the Problem of History" employs "birth of God" to designate the process whereby human beings, by means of some legal order, "gradually begin to discipline their inclinations, internalize the plan of providence, and take charge of their own destiny" (p.36). What Kant famously dubbed "unsociable sociability", Muchnik calls the "fundamental anthropological fracture" (p.39). Viewing this as part of "the plan of providence" entails a "perspectival shift" for historically-minded philosophers; it requires us to place Kant's "Idea squarely within the genre of philosophical theodicy" (pp.41-43). The authentic theodicy signaled in Idea, Muchnik argues, entails an "internalization of the aim of providence" (p.48): autonomy ("the coming of age of humanity" [p.49]) first becomes possible when the Being who was once regarded as governing us heteronomously is reborn within the human spirit. Muchnik's provocatively pessimistic conclusion, that this process has the "astounding result" of "deepen[ing] the roots of our immorality" (p.55), might leave religious realists questioning: Would this reading of Kant be more appropriately called the death of God?

3. In "The Kantian Summum Bonum and the Requirements of Reason", James H. Joiner concocts a "dilemma" that allegedly plagues Kant's theory of the highest good: by grounding practical reason on the moral law as "the fact of reason", Kant either becomes a "moral realist" (p.65), contravening the first Critique's strictures on knowledge, or he leaves the whole moral realm "untethered" from "reality" (p.69). The problem intensifies in RBBR, when Kant introduces radical evil. Appealing to IDKR's "strange" reading of Kant, whereby Kant's appeal to an "archetype" references "another disposition outside ourselves within God" (p.76), Joiner opts for moral realism. Following IDKR, he treats the so-called "translation reading" of RBBR as the only alternative -- completely ignoring other viable options. Joiner's strategy is fundamentally unKantian: instead of seeking "a third thing", he assumes logic can solve the dilemma and sets up two interpretive options regarding the nature of morality and the impact of evil on the status of the highest good. Kant's only escape from the resulting impasse is to follow IDKR. Joiner unnecessarily assumes the "Duty Reading" and the "Practical Requirement Reading" of the highest good are "competing interpretations" (p.61); actually, as complementary perspectives on humanity's moral vocation, both are equally true, which is why Kant's relevant texts support both.[2]

4. David Bradshaw's "Kant and the Experience of God" argues (p.80) "that Kant seriously misunderstands the relationship between experience of and conceptual beliefs about God, and that when this relationship is clarified his arguments are seen to have little force." Bradshaw's exposition is plagued by questionable presuppositions -- the foremost being that Kant thinks "there can be no experience of God" (p.80). Kant affirms this claim only under narrow definitions of "God" and "experience", definitions that leave ample room for a quasi-mystical encounter with God to be both possible and crucial to human welfare.[3] While admitting "Kant does not . . . entirely close the door on the possibility of the experience of God" (p.86), Bradshaw shows how the Bible depicts various encounters with God as "direct experience" (p.88); but this is irrelevant, because Kantian "experience" is always indirect/mediate. Kant's denial that we can "experience God" does not exclude encountering God through immediate experiences that do not generate theoretical knowledge. Thus, Bradshaw's observation that the Psalmist's "experience of God is . . . virtually unlimited . . . ; everything is done before God's eyes" (p.89) actually echoes Kant's frequent testimony to his deep awareness of God's inward presence (e.g., through the voice of conscience); likewise, in RBBR Kant says everything may be considered miraculous. Bradshaw assumes "Kant would, no doubt [sic!], have little patience" with such biblical language (p.90), yet Kant frequently affirms similar sentiments. Bradshaw reads Kant's claim that we cannot pull down the infinite and know it as object (7:63) as if Kant thereby meant to exclude all encounter with God; yet this would be like claiming that, because Isaiah 53:8 depicts God as telling humanity "my thoughts are not your thoughts", none of the Psalmist's reported experiences are genuine. Bradshaw's arguments inadvertently affirm Kant's actual position, that those who claim to have encountered God must never construe such experiences as providing scientific knowledge.

5. Lawrence Pasternack's "Religious Assent and the Question of Theology: Making Room for Historical Faith" summarizes the author's previously-defended interpretation of Kant's theory of propositional attitudes, then effectively defends the need for a reversal in the way interpreters typically view the relation between knowledge and faith. Once we realize that "Kant does not turn to faith because of the 'limits to knowledge,' but rather seeks to establish such limits for the sake of faith, to safeguard it" (p.107), the all-too-common claim that Kant's appeal to faith contravenes those strictures seems implausible. After accusing Kant of referring "misleadingly" (p.110) to a "Second Experiment" in RBBR's second Preface, Pasternack helpfully distinguishes between the four ways historical faith relates to moral faith: (1) "the instruments of Historical Faith [may] function as 'mystical cover' for" pure religion (p.111), through a direct experience -- a point Bradshaw should have taken to heart; (2) some "doctrines of Historical Faith" must be rejected as "anathema to" pure religion (p.112); (3) other aspects of Historical Faith are "Neutral" to pure religion, and (4) certain "Adjunctives" have "a more indirect relationship" to pure religion (p.113), but may encourage us to be moral. Pasternack could have said more about how the Adjunctives illustrate the proper role of historical faith in general by promoting prudence.

6. Leslie Stevenson's title, "Kant versus Christianity", was probably meant to echo the book's title by ending with a question mark, because he refers on page 132 to "the question in my title". Stevenson juxtaposes sections that summarize first Kant's position then typical Christian positions on several key areas of religious belief and practice, mostly relating to revelation and salvation. Using numerous rhetorical questions and offering many inconclusive -- though potentially insightful -- suggestions, this chapter offers readers very little concrete guidance on how Kant's position might overlap or be consistent with Christianity. Instead, it concludes that, whether we call Kant's religious views "'liberal Christianity,' or 'post-Christian theologies,' or 'Christian heresies'" matters less than that we pose the question and seek to answer it in dialogue (p.137).

7. William Abraham begins "Divine Agency and Divine Action in Immanuel Kant" by articulating what is arguably the question mentioned in the book's title (p.138): "How far is the philosophy of Immanuel Kant a help or a hindrance in the defense and renewal of the Christian faith in our contemporary situation?" He compares Kant's "critical strictures" on knowledge to "a Kantian contraceptive pill" that blocks theologians' access to the "revelatory resources" they would need to be productive (p.138). Despite the allergic reaction most Christian analytic philosophers have to using the Kantian prophylactic, Abraham makes a valiant effort to glean something meaningful and productive from Kant's discussion of radical evil and grace in RBBR. He rightly recognizes that Kant (p.153) "is open in principle to the possibility of divine influence in moral regeneration." But he finds "all is far from well in the Kantian ecclesial household" (p.155): Kant's allowances for something like a Christian position are "meagre" (p.156). Abraham thus concludes that theologians should "reject" Kant's attempt to help them, relegating his Critical "shovel" to "the philosophical museum as an artifact that has misled them for centuries" (p.158). A Kantian employment of Abraham's contraceptive metaphor would insist that Kant's medicine only prevents theological pregnancies destined to produce stillborn offspring. Any theological fetus that has a genuine potential for "healthy development" not only survives but flourishes. By decommissioning Kant's prophylactic "shovel", Abraham leaves Christian theologians powerless to reject the stillborn theologies of those who would perpetrate evil in God's name.

8. Jacobs' "Kant and the Problem of Divine Revelation" portrays Kant's (alleged) "deism" regarding revelation (p.163) as failing to disallow the way certain "Eastern Church fathers speak about deification, or human participation in the divine" (p.165). While Jacobs offers an excellent synopsis of this strain of patristic thought, his treatment of Kant's position on revelation is comparatively brief and shallow. Without acknowledging Kant's sustained focus on conscience, the primary Kantian mode of humanity's participation in the divine, and completely ignoring Kant's discussion of God's intellectual intuition (p.178), Jacobs merely assumes that the patristics' "inherently mystical" position (p.171) contradicts Kant's; yet the two may well be compatible. Some interaction with recent interpreters who have defended Kant's "Critical mysticism" would have made Jacobs' argument far more fair and complete. Instead, when Kant uses mystical language about "God appearing or speaking" (p.174), Jacobs chooses not to take his words at face value; suffice it to say that, if Jacobs treated the patristics the way he treats Kant, then the patristics, too, would be agnostic deists, since they (like Kant) insist that "no man ever yet has discovered or can discover" God's essence (p.176). In short, Jacobs sets out to find crucial differences between Kant and the patristics, so he finds just that; had he set out to see them as partners in a common cause, the impressive evidence he unearths could have easily led to that conclusion.

9. In "What Perfection Demands: An Irenaean Account of Kant on Radical Evil", Jacqueline Mariña persuasively argues that Kant's "developmental" account of evil resonates well with Irenaeus' theory of evil. However, her explanation of Kant's position suffers from a serious flaw. She explicitly conflates Kant's references to a "fundamental maxim" with the human "disposition" (Gesinnung); treating these as interchangeable (pp.191-2, 196), she describes "Kant's rigorism thesis" as the assumption that "the disposition is singular". Yet Kant often uses "Gesinnung" in the plural; I therefore translate it as "conviction(s)."[4] Mariña correctly states that "the [evil] propensity follows from the fundamental choice [of a maxim]" (p.196) but identifies this with the choice of a Gesinnung. If this were correct, then when people convert to a good Gesinnung, their evil propensity would vanish; yet Kant repeatedly states that the evil propensity affects even good-hearted persons. This is because the supreme maxim that grounds it never changes, even when people choose to align their convictions (Gesinnungen) with the moral law. Still, Mariña's chapter does effectively explain how Kant's theory of evil differs from Augustine's.

10. Keith Yandell's "Atonement and Grace in Kant" rehashes his previously published objections to Kant's philosophical theology. Pitting Wolterstorff against Mariña, he avoids engaging in "detailed defended exegesis" of Kant's texts (p.202). Without examining increasingly weighty evidence for the opposite conclusion, Yandell confidently asserts: "a Kantian God does no forgiving" (p.202). He admits his comments are "scandalously brief" (p.205); indeed, his essay is riddled with textual inaccuracies, ambiguous remarks, and outright errors, thus rendering an adequate response impossible in a single paragraph. Moreover, I have previously defended Kant against Yandell's main accusations, especially that Kantian religion constitutes "salvation by works" (p.208); yet he remains tellingly silent about such prior rebuttals.[5] After finally mentioning "atonement" (p.211), he merely quips: "That is another story." Yandell ignores the fact that this other story, historical religion, is the topic of one of RBBR's two "experiments". His list of concluding assertions reveals that Yandell wrongly takes Kantian "virtue" to entail perfection; for Kant, virtue requires a person merely to be on the right path -- a requirement that is within human reach, while still leaving us in need of atonement.

11. Thomas McCall's "Christology . . . within the Limits of Reason Alone? Kant on Fittingness for Atonement" carefully examines Kant's theory of the "archetype" and concludes (p.227): "Kant cannot be considered a friend of traditional Christology, but nor can he be taken seriously as a genuine threat to it." Unfortunately, McCall misses a crucial nuance: Kant's reason for denying the need for a unique instantiation of the archetype is not that Jesus cannot be God,[6] but that everyone has a duty to become such an example. Kant never denies the potential validity of such claims of historical religions, but requires persons of faith to put the rational and the historical in their proper order of priority. Lacking interpretive charity, McCall grounds his argument on a false dichotomy ("either fittingness or divinity"), mistakenly claiming that for Kant "divinity actually disqualifies someone from candidacy" for instantiating the archetype (pp.218-219). Kant's actual claim is that an instantiation of the archetype cannot be non-human; he explicitly acknowledges that a religious leader could rightly be called (for example) "God's Son," as long as those who follow also have the potential to be God's children -- just as the Bible teaches (though Christians typically do not take Scripture literally here). McCall offers a powerful analogy (pp.224f): if LeBron James were player-coach for a team of novice basketball players, and his teammates improve as a result, they would deserve praise for their improvement. Kant would agree but respond that, if LeBron were immune to gravity and his novice teammates were not, this would significantly limit his ability to motivate them to improve.[7] Contrary to McCall's conclusion, moral laziness is a threat that every Christian theologian should take seriously.

12. Firestone's "Rational Religious Faith in a Bodily Resurrection" offers a controversial defense of the claim that Kant's theory of religion requires belief in bodily resurrection. He begins by reviewing IDKR's attempt to defend Kant against the aforementioned "conundrums." As in IDKR, Firestone writes as if he and Jacobs were the first to argue "that both of Kant's experiments are present within Religion" and that RBBR "present[s] a template for what is required of any historical faith that is to be labeled rational" (p.234); yet both of these claims (like several other key points that IDKR presents as original insights), were thoroughly defended in Palmquist's 2000 book, Kant's Critical Religion (hereafter KCR). After summarizing Athenagoras' argument for bodily resurrection and comparing it to an excellent argument recently advanced by Aaron Bunch,[8] Firestone notes (p.246) that IDKR interprets Kant's theory of the archetype as "an ideal substance in a Platonic sense." Ironically, if the Kantian archetype "is the Form of morally perfect humanity," then this undermines the very claim Firestone's chapter aims to defend, for Plato's Form of ideal humanity is the soul, not the body! By contrast, bodies are absolutely indispensable for "the symbolic/metaphorical reading" (this being IDKR's name for KCR's position), which Firestone mentions once but leaves curiously unexplained.[9] As Firestone correctly states, "how one understands Kant's" theory of the archetype "affects the profundity of this insight" (p.247). The irony here is that Platonic Forms are just as real if they are disembodied, whereas a symbol must be embodied in order to fulfill its function. Thus, while I completely agree with Firestone (and Bunch before him), that Kant's archetype requires embodiment and thus supports faith in resurrection, I regard this chapter as some of the best evidence yet put forward as to why IDKR's interpretation of the archetype is grossly mistaken.

All in all, this book is well worth reading for anyone interested in the wide variety of contemporary approaches to Kant's theory of religion. While one might question the appropriateness of the title, it has the merit of causing readers to wonder -- this being Plato's proverbial starting point for philosophy. Another questionable feature of the book is its rather uneven editing -- perhaps a result of having too many fingers in the editorial pie. Thus, the formatting is not standardized between the chapters (e.g., only DiCenso uses bold print when quoting Kant), Joiner states (p.64) that one of Kant's most oft-quoted passages ("Two things fill the mind . . . ") comes from the first Critique, whereas it actually come from the second, Abraham gets away with referring to the theories Kant advanced in his Critique of Practical Judgment, though Kant never wrote a book with that title, and typos appear every few pages. Despite such defects, what seems beyond question is that, if this book's inconclusive questioning is taken as a litmus test as to Kant's relevance to contemporary debates concerning the nature of theology and religion, then as Firestone aptly puts it (p.231): "The endeavor of navigating Religion well has . . . become like the quest for the Holy Grail within Kant scholarship." I suspect that Kant himself would agree, noting that those who focus on the alleged conundrums -- pro or con -- have seriously missed the point.


Bunch, Aaron (2010). "The Resurrection of the Body as a 'Practical Postulate': Why Kant Is Committed to Belief in an Embodied Afterlife", Philosophia Christi 12, pp.46-60.

Firestone, Chris L. (2009). Kant and Theology at the Boundaries of Reason. Ashgate.

Firestone, Chris L. (2012). "A Response to Critics of In Defense of Kant’s Religion", Faith and Philosophy 29.2 (April), pp.193-209.

Firestone, Chris L. and Nathan A. Jacobs (2008). In Defense of Kant's Religion. Indiana University Press.

Firestone, Chris L. and Stephen R. Palmquist (2006). Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion. Indiana University Press.

Fugate, Courtney (2014). "The Highest Good and Kant's Proof(s) of God's Existence", History of Philosophy Quarterly 31.2, pp.137-158.

Kant, Immanuel (2009). Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason. Translated by Werner S. Pluhar. Hackett.

Palmquist, Stephen R. (1987). "A Priori Knowledge in Perspective: (II) Naming, Necessity and the Analytic A Posteriori", The Review of Metaphysics 41, pp.255-282.

Palmquist, Stephen R. (2000). Kant's Critical Religion: Volume Two of Kant's System of Perspectives. Ashgate.

Palmquist, Stephen R. (2007). "Kantian Redemption: A Critical Challenge to Christian Views of Faith and Works", Philosophia Christi 9, pp.29-38.

Palmquist, Stephen R. (2010). "Kant's Ethics of Grace: Perspectival Solutions to the Moral Difficulties with Divine Assistance", The Journal of Religion 90, pp.530-553.

Palmquist, Stephen R. (2012). "Could Kant's Jesus Be God?", International Philosophical Quarterly 52, pp.421-437.

Palmquist, Stephen R. (2015b). "What is Kantian Gesinnung? On the Priority of Volition over Metaphysics and Psy­chology in Kant's Religion", Kantian Review 20, pp.235-64.

Palmquist, Stephen R. (2018). Baring All in Reason's Light: An Interpretation and Defense of Kant's Critical Mysticism. Noesis Press.

Pasternack, Lawrence R. (2013). Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Kant on Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason: An Interpretation and Defense. Routledge.

[1] See Palmquist 1987.

[2] See Fugate 2014.

[3] See Palmquist 2018, which refines and updates arguments first defended in Palmquist 2000.

[4] Palmquist 2015b offers a sustained defense of this translation.

[5] Palmquist 2007 was initially presented in a conference session where Yandell also presented. See also "Kant and Theology: Friend or Foe?", a debate between Yandell and me, held at Trinity College in December 2005.

[6] See Palmquist 2012.

[7] This is the point of my argument in Palmquist 2010: Kant never claims God could not offer grace as a free gift through the miraculous act of a savior who is divine in a way that the people he saves are not; rather, his claim is that belief in such a savior will tend to make rational followers of that religion morally lazy, thus detracting from their actual goodness, the very thing salvation should enhance. If LeBron James could fly, then having him as a teammate-coach would not help his gravity-bound, novice teammates to improve.

[8] See Bunch 2010.

[9] On p.232n Firestone briefly describes this "third reading," citing Pasternack 2013 and one post-2008 article by Palmquist. But his description is incomprehensible. This misleading footnote only perpetuates the false impression that IDKR gave, which (when challenged) was explicitly defended in Firestone 2012 -- namely, the claim that KCR contains no substantive theory regarding Kant's two experiments.