Kant and the Reorientation of Aesthetics: Finding the World

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Joseph J. Tinguely, Kant and the Reorientation of Aesthetics: Finding the World, Routledge, 2018, 233 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138081970.

Reviewed by Brent Kalar, University of New Mexico


Joseph Tinguely's fine book makes a strong case that the affective domain plays an essential role in the human intentional relation to the empirical world. He shows how Kant's critical philosophy not only makes an original connection between affectivity and intentionality, but also uniquely emphasizes the way in which the affects can be subject to normativity. Tinguely's stated aim is laudably modest. He does not claim to have necessarily captured Kant's actual intentions or provided a complete theory of affective intentionality, but only to have provisionally opened up a new area for investigation that is of general philosophical interest (25-29). Indeed, his account does seem incomplete in places. Nevertheless, this work is a significant achievement. Following an overview of the project in the first chapter, the remaining chapters are self-standing studies, the cumulative effect of which is to reorient our impressions of what is significant about Kant's philosophy, and, at a minimum, strongly suggest that our connection to the world requires an affectivity subject to normative demands.

The second chapter investigates the cognitive role of the productive imagination in empirical judgment, which Tinguely proposes to derive from its synthetic function in aesthetic judgment (37). The proximate motivation for his recourse to aesthetics comes from the need to respond to familiar objections against the conceptualist reading of Kant associated with Strawson and Sellars. According to this reading, the ability to notice a specific object requires having a prior concept of it; this, however, seems to render the acquisition of concepts, as well as the experience of infants and animals, utterly mysterious (55). To formulate a conceptualism that avoids these objections, Tinguely turns to the Third Critique's solution to the Antinomy of Taste, which posits "an indeterminate concept" as the key to understanding beauty (59). Tinguely identifies this "concept" with an indeterminate conceptual form, in accordance with "the understanding's lawfulness in general" or "the power of concepts as such," which he glosses as "a feature of the mind's orientation toward the sense manifold -- the way it is taken up, not its specific contents" (61-63). On his reconstruction, Kantian conceptualism holds that the intentional relation to an object is originally constituted by the imagination's synthesis of this "concept-like" form.

Positing that the synthesis underlying the aesthetic judgment of the beautiful has an essential role in empirical cognition implies that feeling plays a role in the synthesis of the manifold of every empirical object, and Tinguely embraces this implication in a later chapter (167). Granting the intelligibility of claiming a synthesizing role for a feeling, the nature of the synthesis itself raises difficult questions familiar to scholars of Kant's aesthetics. One basic problem is simply to make non-trivial sense of the notion that there is a general "conceptual" way of taking up a manifold that is not even in principle reducible to any particular determinate act, or set of acts, of conceptualization. A second problem is that Tinguely's account, in making the aesthetic synthesis which is constitutive of beautiful form a precondition of the cognitive synthesis, would appear to have the implication that everything is beautiful. This conclusion should be unwelcome, insofar as it makes nonsense of the presumption that taste is a capacity for discrimination that must be cultivated.

Both of these strike me as difficult (although perhaps surmountable) challenges for Tinguely's approach. To his credit, he does recognize and attempt to respond to the first problem (64). What he calls "conceptuality" is, he says, "a particular way of perceiving or mode of activity in which the mind binds together the manifold of sense, not just in light of spatio-temporal coherence but also teleological cogence" (65). Tinguely borrows the notion of "teleological cogence" from Longuenesse, according to whom the synthetic activity of the imagination aims at, hence anticipates, a "whole" that is not present (52-53). While this may represent a start in addressing the problem, it strikes me as incomplete. Indeed, all that has been accomplished, it seems to me, is to change the terms of the problem, for now one wants to know how the "whole" can anticipated independently of a determinate concept. Tinguely's descriptions of this remain at a highly suggestive and metaphorical level, referring to obscure mental acts of "having," "holding," and "opening out" (65). Further, it is not clear that this would provide a plausible notion of beautiful form, which is, of course, the other crucial function that the account of "conceptuality" must perform.

The third chapter explores what Tinguely sees as a general theory implicit in Kant's threefold division of language into "tone, modulation, and sensation" (71-72). Through an original and searching analysis of these notions, he develops suggestions regarding the "modulation" of our "attunement" to the world which complicates the standard Kantian model of the mind-world relation as the simple fitting of concept to intuition (73).

In the fourth chapter, Tinguely's aim is to demonstrate that the Kantian notion of judgment and Aristotelian rhetoric share "an integrated picture of the affective sensibilities and cognitive capacities" (97). In both, concepts used for communication are understood to function to inform, not only the way individual objects appear, but also "one's disposition or orientation to the world as a whole" in a way that is linked to "specifically affective states of mind" (97). Tinguely associates the famous Kantian claim that intuitions without concepts are blind with the Aristotelian notion that the function of the speaker is to make things appear in the "right light" (101). He suggests that, because it belongs to rhetoric to reside in the gap between empirical intuitions and concepts, empirical judgments are inherently open to "rhetorical contestation," in that it is "always debatable whether one perceives an object or a scene under the right conceptual description" (105). If how we experience things is subject to the concepts and judgments we bring to them, and this can be done better or worse, then experiences themselves -- "what one sees" -- can be praised or blamed (105).

The fifth chapter attempts to illuminate the nature of Kantian quarrels over taste. In the Antinomy of Taste, Kant denies that aesthetic judgments can ever be deductively proven, yet admits that we can and do properly quarrel over matters of beauty (5:338). In what, then, does this quarreling consist? Rather than tackling this problem directly in the context of Kant's overall aesthetic theory, Tinguely takes the indirect route of examining a parallel dispute between Hume and Rousseau about the communication of affect. In this dispute, Rousseau emphasizes the "musical" dimension of language: its ability to convey not just concepts but feelings (134-138). This Rousseauian idea, of course, seems to naturally dovetail with Tinguely's discussions of the "attuning" function of tone and rhetoric in the preceding chapters. He goes on to show how Kant follows Rousseau in claiming that language contains a capacity for affective communication in the "tone" which originates in the speaker's affective state and communicates that state to the listener (139). For Kant, Tinguely concludes, a "quarrel (Streit)" is "a demand for agreement in a particular case where the agreement is established not through shared concepts but through a shared sense or 'feeling'" which is "a demand . . . placed upon an affective state" (149).

Tinguely must be commended for being one of the few commentators to take seriously Kant's commitment to quarreling. In my view, this commitment has much broader implications than has generally been recognized, and the failure to take it into account raises serious questions about the viability of most leading interpretations of Kant's theory of taste. Tinguely usefully lays out some of the historical background of this notion, and its development in Kant's own writing. However, I wonder whether, in the end, he has confronted the most serious philosophical issues involved here. As I see it, one danger is that, in order to preserve its distinction from deductive proving, an account of quarrelling will reduce it to mere emotive persuading. It is not clear to me that Tinguely avoids this danger; in particular, the implication that "rhetorical contestation" may be involved in quarrelling is concerning. What rational norms govern rhetorical persuasion, other than that of success at accomplishing the ends of the persuader? I fear that the normativity that Tinguely wants to preserve in quarrelling cannot be accounted for if it is reduced to emotional factors like tone of voice and rhetorical appeals.

In the sixth chapter, Tinguely proposes to read Kant as an "internal objectivist" about beauty. An "internalist" holds that the pleasure in the beautiful is a constituent feature of aesthetic judgment itself, while an "objectivist" claims that the pleasure has an intentional relationship to properties of the object judged (as well as to the subject's mental state) (157). On this view, then, there is an act of aesthetic discrimination that picks out objective features of empirical objects in and through the feeling of pleasure (163). Despite being in tension with Kant's claims about the subjectivity of aesthetic judgment, on Tinguely's view, a feeling of pleasure is not only constitutive of the judgment of an empirical object, it could even be involved, in lieu of a concept, in actively synthesizing and schematizing the manifold (167-172).

While he makes a fair case for objectivism as a reading of Kant, this is a point at which Tinguely's view is perhaps better considered as a revisionary reading that is an interesting philosophical position in its own right. By the same token, however, it is also very schematic, and a number of thorny metaphysical questions -- particularly concerning the nature of pleasure -- would need to be worked out to make it fully convincing. For instance, one basic issue that would need to be addressed is whether pleasure is to be understood on the model of a qualitatively identifiable sensation, or rather (in an Aristotelian vein) as a status-term that supervenes upon a variety of heterogeneous activities. In the absence of such an account, it is not clear how to assess the claim that objective features are being discriminated by means of a pleasure.

Finally, the seventh chapter argues that "the ability to orient oneself in the world requires knowledge claims about sense objects that cannot be made without an irreducible aesthetic or felt discrimination" (185). The Kantian concept of "orientation" is derived principally from his 1786 essay, "What does it mean to orient oneself in thinking?" While this essay, as the title indicates, is concerned with orientation in thinking -- especially with the question of the role of reason in relation to the "practical postulates" of God and immortality -- Tinguely's concern is with what he argues is the more fundamental question of orientation in the world of human experience (187). Since Kant posits that such orientation takes place by means of a feeling, a question arises as to whether orientation is merely subjective (188).

Against this, Tinguely is concerned to defend an objective and cognitive role for feeling. He begins by arguing that the example of "incongruent counterparts" shows that Kant needs more than an argument for a pure intuition of space in order to explain how practical orientation in the empirical world is possible (193). While orientation in pure space is a two-term relation between a subject and an external object, orientation in the empirical world is a three-term relation between subject, object, and world (195). Tinguely convincingly argues that the "familiarity" of an object is a product of a relation of analogy between the subject and the object, and the object and the world (198-199). Such an analogous relation is what Kant calls "symbolic presentation" (5:232; cited 198). Therefore, Tinguely concludes, "One can succeed in orienting oneself in the world by treating the object term as a symbol for the world as a whole" (199). However, because the original positioning of objects in space occurs, according to Kant, via a feeling of left and right, the symbolic relation itself must be represented through feeling (200). Thus, it is through a feeling that the world as a whole reveals itself. In Tinguely's words, "To say, then, that a feeling reveals the layout of the world as a whole in this sense means, simply, that taking a given object (e.g., the Pole Star) as a symbol for the world commits the subject to placing a wider constellation of objects (both given and not given to view) to one's right and another to the left" (200). This "placing" is objective because of the sort of commitment it entails, which, "even though it takes the form of a feeling, is not a mere projection of the way things 'feel to me' but constitutes a non-discursive form of liability to the way things, in fact, stand in respect to the world" (201). Hence, such feelings can be right and wrong; they stand within the normative sphere of justification.

As interesting as it is, I am left with the impression that Tinguely's concept of orientation is strangely disconnected from the main point that Kant makes about how the realm of the aesthetic symbol orients us, viz., toward the supersensible. Indeed, Tinguely systematically downplays the role of this central feature of Kant's philosophy. The supersensible is most conspicuously set aside in the discussions of the Antinomy of Taste in the second and fifth chapters, but it is also implicitly bypassed in the way Tinguely truncates his discussions of fine art and the symbol. This might be defended if orientation in the empirical world could be neatly separated from orientation in relation to the supersensible, but I think this can be done only at the cost of rendering the empirical orientation abstract and schematic. If the question is how I, as a human being, navigate my world practically, I agree with Tinguely that, for Kant, something like a feeling of place is required. But this feeling, in its ultimate practical sense, is supplied for Kant by the culture that surrounds us, which communicates supersensible moral ideas symbolically through (for example) fine art. Kant famously introduces the symbol in the Third Critique in order to argue that "beauty is a symbol of morality" (§59). Symbols also play an important role in Kant's considered view of fine art, specifically in connection with the doctrine of "aesthetic ideas," where they are linked to culture (§50-52). In my view, the rudimentary orientation that Tinguely describes would be practically fruitless without the broader orientation provided by culture, and the Kantian account of culture contains an essential reference to the supersensible.

Brief summaries cannot do justice to the commendable care, detail, and nuance exhibited throughout this book. While he does not rest his case on being a "correct" interpretation of Kant, Tinguely engages with the literature in a serious and substantial way, and every Kant scholar concerned with these issues will benefit from his insights. His engaging and original book undoubtedly opens up new avenues of thought about Kant, and is well worth reading for a broader audience of philosophers as well.