Kant and the Role of Pleasure in Moral Action

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Iain P. D. Morrisson, Kant and the Role of Pleasure in Moral Action, Ohio UP, 2008, 204 pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780821418307.

Reviewed by Robert B. Louden, University of Southern Maine



"Thought [dianoia] by itself moves nothing", Aristotle declares in the Nicomachean Ethics (1139a35-36), and two thousand years later Hume echoes this position in his Treatise: “reason alone can never produce any action, or give rise to volition” (II.III.iii). But Kant, though well aware of the obstacles confronting him, believes that reason plays a bigger role in human action. In a transcription from one of his ethics lectures presented in the mid-1770s he states: "Obviously the understanding [Verstand] can judge, but to give to this judgment of the understanding a power, to make it an incentive able to move the will to performance of an action — this is the philosopher’s stone [Stein der Weisen]" [Immanuel Kant, Vorlesung zur Moral Philosophie, edited by Werner Stark, Walter de Gruyter, 2004, p. 69].

Kant eventually becomes convinced that a philosopher’s stone (the elusive substance sought by alchemists for converting base metals into gold) exists in ethics via the concept of respect (Achtung). But here is where the interpretive battle begins: given his frequent assertions that respect is what motivates us to act morally, what exactly is Kantian respect — a feeling or a reason? The safe bet here may be “both”, for in a famous footnote in the Groundwork Kant says that "though respect is a feeling [Gefühl], it is not one received by means of influence; it is, instead, a feeling self-wrought by means of a rational concept" (4: 401n.). However, most contemporary Anglophone interpreters of Kant defend one or another cognitive reading of respect. Granted, there is a feeling dimension to respect, but the heavy lifting (motivating humans to act morally) is done by reason.

Iain Morrisson, in Kant and the Role of Pleasure in Moral Action, boldly sets out to defend the counter-position, in effect moving Kant closer to Aristotle and Hume. On his view, "Kant’s moral feeling of respect can and does motivate moral action" (2). However, the opening fireworks are softened considerably by means of the often-invoked distinction between pathological and nonpathological feelings, a distinction that Kant himself relies on in the above-cited remark from the Groundwork. Pathological feelings are caused by our susceptibility to sensible objects; nonpathological feelings are caused independently of our sensible susceptibility to objects (cf. 2). Morrisson argues prudently that Kantian respect “is a nonpathological feeling that motivates moral action”, but this concession moves him somewhat closer to the dominant cognitive interpretation of respect (3).

However, Morrisson’s project also has several additional and interrelated novel features. For instance, though he holds that respect is a nonpathological feeling, he also argues that it “motivates moral action in a way that is identical (in crucial respects) to the way in which pathological feelings motivate desire-based actions” (4). Kant’s theory of moral motivation, in other words, is allegedly not all that different from his theory of nonmoral motivation. Also, Morrisson does not think that the proper way to determine Kant’s theory of moral motivation is simply to examine his texts, for the relevant texts are ambivalent: "Kant consistently maintains what appear to be contradictory positions" on respect; “a balanced and close reading of the immediately relevant texts just does not resolve the issue at hand” (5, 6). Morrisson’s strategy is instead to project what Kant should have said about respect by using his theory of nonmoral motivation as the relevant background for his theory of moral motivation. Morrisson finds the theory of nonmoral motivation primarily in Kant’s empirical investigations into human nature, i.e., in his anthropological works.

Kant and the Role of Pleasure in Moral Action is divided into an Introduction, five chapters, and a brief Conclusion; it also includes Notes, References, and a very short Index. In the Introduction (“Methodology and Two Kinds of Ethics”), Morrisson outlines his position and explains how he will proceed in the rest of the book. Chapter 1 (“Kant’s Psychology in the Nonmoral Context”) explores Kant’s treatment of the faculties of desire and feeling with an eye toward elucidating Kant’s theory of nonmoral motivation.

In Chapter 2 (“Desire Formation and Hedonism”), the author aims to disambiguate Kant’s remarks about pleasure. On Morrisson’s reading — and here we encounter another currently controversial claim defended in the book — Kant’s account of desire formation commits him “to a form of hedonism” (24). The book’s title, which to my ears does not adequately reflect the nature and scope of the author’s project, hooks up best with this particular claim. Now, however, an additional problem emerges for the author’s primary goal of correctly analyzing respect. Respect, like the Kantian sublime, is double-sided and involves both pain and pleasure. Respect begins in pain when it "strikes down self-conceit" and humbles our egoistic tendencies, but it is then transformed into pleasure when we realize that our own moral personality is the source of the moral law out of respect for which we are to act (Critique of Practical Reason 5: 73). Morrisson’s title and his defense of Kant’s alleged hedonism only capture one side of this complex phenomenon.

In Chapter 3 (“Nonmoral Freedom in Kant”), Morrisson argues, again contrary to some recent commentators, that Kant’s theory of nonmoral action is not deterministic. On his reading, both our nonmoral and moral acts are “free, principled, and yet sensuously affected” (81). In Chapter 4 (“Rational Action”) Morrisson looks more carefully at the structure of nonmoral choices and tries to show that Henry Allison’s influential Incorporation Thesis (the basic outlines of which Morrisson accepts, and according to which all actions are chosen on the basis of maxims) can be reconciled, appearances to the contrary, with the common phenomenon of weakness of the will. In Chapter 5 (“Respect as an Incentive to Moral Action”) Morrisson draws together the various threads of his account of Kant’s theory of nonmoral action to try to make good on his key claim that respect motivates as a feeling in the moral sphere.

Finally, in his Conclusion (“Reath and the Question of Motivation”), the author raises several challenges to Andrews Reath’s recent reading of Kant on respect. On Reath’s view, "the feeling of respect is an incentive only in an attenuated sense", whereas Morrisson holds that the feeling of respect is an incentive in a much more robust sense (“Kant’s Theory of Moral Sensibility”, reprinted in Reath, Agency and Autonomy in Kant’s Moral Theory, Oxford UP, 2006, p. 11). Morrisson also objects to what he calls “the fractured way” in which Reath reads respect (163). (Reath sees respect as having both an intellectual or practical as well as an affective side — in my view, a reasonable gloss on Kant’s earlier-cited remark from the Groundwork.) Additionally, Morrisson takes issue with Reath’s position that on Kant’s view inclinations ought to influence our choices in so far as they can be regarded as sources of reasons that other members of the moral community can also endorse. Morrisson objects that this interpretation both downplays the necessary affective dimension of human choice and that “it does not get much in the way of support from Kant’s works” (169). The latter claim, however, seems a doubly odd point on which to end a book. First of all, as noted above, in his Introduction Morrisson explicitly eschews Kant’s texts as the criterion for determining Kant’s position on respect. He finds the relevant texts to be ambivalent, and goes instead with Kant “should have said”. Second, the related concepts of universalizability and “thinking in the position of everyone else” are surely among the most pervasive in all of Kant’s works (cf. Critique of the Power of Judgment 5: 294).

I have offered a few criticisms of Kant and the Role of Pleasure in Moral Action, but let me end on a positive note. Morrisson is writing about a very important issue, one that is crucial not only for Kant but for all philosophers who are concerned with the nature of human action. He writes clearly, is familiar with the relevant Anglophone secondary literature, and is not shy in challenging currently fashionable views about Kant’s theory of moral motivation.