Kant and the Scottish Enlightenment

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Elizabeth Robinson and Chris W. Surprenant (eds.), Kant and the Scottish Enlightenment, Routledge, 2018, 367pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138207011

Reviewed by Sam Fleischacker, University of Illinois, Chicago


This book is a festschrift for Manfred Kuehn. No topic could be more fitting for such a volume. As Paul Guyer says, at the opening of his contribution, "No one has done more than Manfred Kuehn to impress on us the importance of Scottish philosophy for Kant." If anything, this understates the significance of Kuehn's work. Kuehn offers a nice summary of some of the main points of his scholarship here, in which he stresses, inter alia, how much the Scottish influence on Kant may help explain why Scotland became one of the central venues for the reception of Kant's own work. "There appears to be no place outside of Germany where Kant's thought was assimilated so readily, so thoroughly, and with such lasting effects, as in Scotland," says Kuehn (p.7), pointing to the work of such figures as Norman Kemp Smith and H.J. Paton as examples (he could also have mentioned Edward Caird and W.H. Walsh).

Kuehn has always been especially interested in affinities between Kant and Reid. This collection includes papers on that connection, but also on Kant and Hutcheson, Kant and Hume, and Kant and Smith, in addition to a piece by Guyer on Kant and Beattie (whom Kant almost certainly did not read, but whose notion of common sense, Guyer argues plausibly, resembles Kant's in certain ways). The collection is varied in other respects as well, covering topics from epistemology and moral philosophy to political theory, aesthetics, and the philosophy of religion. And it combines contributions from well-known scholars with the work of young people who are just beginning their careers. The volume is thus nicely comprehensive, along a number of dimensions.

As is the case with many edited collections, however, and perhaps especially with a festschrift, the quality of the contributions varies greatly. Some of the articles do not address the official subject of the volume at all. One piece on Hutcheson mentions Kant only in its last two pages. Two other pieces are devoted entirely to Kant, with barely a word on any Scottish figure. Other pieces are frustratingly unclear, or present a confused version of what either Kant or his purported Scottish counterpart was arguing. The volume as a whole is also marred by an extraordinary number of typos, and uncorrected errors of grammar. These run throughout the book, sometimes appearing on every other page. On several occasions, they include serious errors, rendering entire sentences unintelligible. The editors, and Routledge, do scholarship a grave disservice by putting out such a sloppily edited volume.

These limitations aside, there are some gems here. Three pieces, by Michael Walschots, Wiebke Deimling and Oliver Sensen, explore the role of moral sense and moral feeling in Kant's practical philosophy, offering a variety of interesting suggestions about similarities between Kant and Hutcheson, Walschots' piece, especially, presents an astute, close reading of the pre-Critical writings in which Kant flirted with moral sentimentalism. Reed Winegar, J. Colin McQuillan and Paul Guyer give us a similarly varied and insightful set of pieces on elements of Kant's aesthetics that echo or parallel themes in Hutcheson, Hume and Beattie. Robert Louden and Elizabeth Robinson carefully delineate the debt that Kant's anthropology owes to Hume. Alexander Schaefer reconstructs Kant's political philosophy as a response to Hume, which results in the clearest and most convincing short account of Kant's version of the social contract that I have ever seen; I plan to assign it whenever I teach Kant's political philosophy in the future. And John McHugh examines in detail what Adam Smith may have meant by saying, at one moment in his Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS), that reason motivates us, and the extent to which that passage, and his views on moral motivation more broadly, may have anticipated Kant.

Because these pieces are so incisive and suggestive, they also of course give rise to philosophical controversy. I shall focus on a few of their more debatable, but also interesting, elements in the remainder of this review.

First, to Walschots reading of Kant on the moral sense. He is quite right to say (p.40) that there is a certain universality to Hutcheson's moral sense -- all human beings are supposed to have it and it is supposed to approve and disapprove of the same general qualities -- and that Kant eventually rejected the idea that morality could be based on any such sense because he saw it as "incapable of issuing . . . principles to a sufficient degree of universality" (46). Walschots also provides a nuanced account of how Kant's assimilation of moral sense to moral feeling, and view of feeling, in the Critique of the Power of Judgment (CPJ), as ineluctably subjective, plays into his rejection of its capacity to issue universal moral judgments, and he draws our attention astutely to the features of Kant's early writings that suggest he was hesitant about Hutcheson's claims for the moral sense even then. But two interesting features of those early writings go missing in this account (as they also do in Deimling's and Sensen's pieces). First, Kant's first, short discussion of morality in the Prize Essay (Ak 2:298-301) concerns the good -- what we take to be our end -- as much as, if not more than, the right -- how we decide what to do. And second, Kant proposes that a feeling of pleasure must be the ultimate touchstone of goodness because only it can stop the regress we fall into when we ask, of each of our proximate ends, "But what is that end good for?" There are intimations here of a view not unlike those of G.E. Moore and Iris Murdoch, in which what is ultimately good can only be seen rather than argued for, and in which the kind of perception in question is one that need not allow for a sharp distinction between morality and aesthetics. But if so, then it is a mistake to see Hutcheson's influence on Kant as ending when Kant opted for universal rational principles as the proper basis for determining right action. Instead, we can see that influence as extending to the role attributed to a universalizable kind of feeling in CPJ, and the morally-tinged beauty it leads us to approve of, and should bear it in mind whenever we consider Kant's value theory (his account of the highest good, for instance), rather than his moral theory. And if I am right about why Kant appealed to feeling in his early speculations on goodness, there may be a line from Hutcheson's account of both beauty and morality, via Kant, to Moore and Murdoch -- a possibility in the history of value theory eminently worthy of further exploration.

This connection between aesthetics and morality lends support to Winegar's claim, drawn from Kuehn, that the aesthetic concerns of the first part of CPJ belong far more appropriately together with the teleological concerns of the second part of that book than scholars have hitherto recognized. On the other hand, Winegar and Kuehn give historical reasons for this claim that I think are overstated. It is anachronistic, they say, to distinguish sharply between aesthetics and teleology in the 18th century (71): many writers of that period brought these subjects together. Winegar notes that that is especially true of Hutcheson's Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue, and proposes that CPJ be read in the light of that Inquiry. But this comparison overlooks something important. Hutcheson, like most people in his day, believed firmly in the design proof of God's existence, which stresses the order and beauty of the universe. Kant rejected that proof, in part perhaps under the influence of Hume, and he certainly followed Hume in giving a purely subjective account of beauty, firmly rejecting, among other things, the idea that beauty could possibly represent perfection. That undercuts the use of the beauty of the universe to argue for its having been created by God. So, the assimilation of aesthetics and teleology in CPJ remains an oddity: a leftover, at best, from earlier traditions that do not have a clear place in Kant's Critical system.

Robert Louden makes a convincing case for the influence of Hume on Kant's anthropology, but he presents that case as part of a larger project based on the questionable idea that "both Hume's and Kant's popular, applied philosophical writings are an underappreciated side of their writing." (165) Louden is not alone in this judgment of Hume's popular writings, especially; he cites James Harris' animadversions on those who insist on interpreting all of Hume's writings in the light of the Treatise, and a significant trend in modern Hume scholarship agrees with Louden and Harris on this. Louden also claims that Hume himself was "a great fan" of popular philosophy, citing the passage in the first Enquiry in which Hume says that "the easy and obvious philosophy will always, with the generality of mankind, have the preference above the accurate and the abstruse."

But Louden overlooks the irony of this last quotation from Hume, which ends by noting the superiority, in point of fame, of Cicero over Aristotle, La Bruyere over Malebranche, and Addison over Locke -- rankings, all, that it is unimaginable that Hume himself shared.  Louden also overlooks the passage's dialectical function in the context of a chapter that is designed to convince us precisely that a book of "accurate and abstruse" philosophy like the Enquiry can play an important role in our lives even if it is somewhat difficult to read. That suggests that Hume's feelings about popular philosophy were complex, as indeed they seem to be, and that he did not himself scant the greater achievement of his Treatise, two Enquiries, and Dialogues of Natural Religion. In any case, it is hard to imagine that he would be much remembered today, by anyone except scholars of 18th-century Britain, had he confined himself to his occasional pieces, interesting as they often are, and his History.

Something similar goes, more strongly, for the popular writings of Kant. If, when Louden says that these works are underappreciated, he means simply that they are underappreciated as a key to what Kant believed, he may well be right. But if he means that these works, especially the writings on anthropology, are underappreciated in quality, then I wonder if he can possibly be serious. Louden is himself an important contributor to the growing literature on Kant's racism, something he indeed mentions here (169-70). Not only is that racism vividly on display throughout Kant's anthropological writings, however, but the only moral cure for it in Kant's system -- the only element of Kant's views that can possibly vindicate the humanistic egalitarianism for which he is admired -- is his insistence on the a priori nature of moral reasoning and moral principles, from which it follows that all human beings, whatever their empirical qualities, must be of equal and absolute value. To elevate Kant's appallingly inegalitarian anthropological writings to the stature of the rest of his work, in that case, has got to be a moral mistake.

Those writings are also shallow and unoriginal. It is hard to imagine that a Kant who had written even the best of his popular writings -- "What is Enlightenment?," say, or the "Theory and Practice" essay -- would be remembered today as more than a minor scribbler of the 18th-century, and that a Kant who had written just the Anthropology and the Physical Geography would be remembered at all. So, while it is indeed important for scholars to read the popular writings of Hume and Kant if they want to develop a full, warts-and-all understanding of what they believed, it is a mistake to suggest that these pieces should be given the same serious attention that the Treatise and Enquiries and three Critiques deserve.

A brief note on Schaefer's reconstruction of Kant's political philosophy. He reads Kant as trying to avoid the contingency and instrumentalism of Hume's account of government, while heeding the lessons of Hume's critique of social contract theory. This reading winds up illuminating both the rationale for and the details of Kant's political theory quite wonderfully, but it obscures the enormous degree to which Kant was also trying to make sense of Rousseau's general will. As a scholarly matter, this imbalance may be a price worth paying, as a corrective to readings that have obscured Hume's influence on Kant's politics, but it would be a great mistake, generally, to overlook the importance of Rousseau.

Finally, a word on McHugh's intriguing and subtle reading of Smith. The fact that Smith describes reason as motivating us at one point in TMS has of course been very exciting to Kantians (including the author of this review), but no one (again including this author) has yet explained why a generally sentimentalist moral theorist would make such a remark. The passage in question concerns what leads us to avoid grave injustice to strangers: to prefer the loss of our own finger to killing a multitude of strangers, for instance. McHugh points out, rightly, that what Smith says about reason elsewhere in TMS doesn't do much to explain its role here, and that the passage goes on to suggest that what leads us to act on reason is the love of our own self-approval. Weaving this latter point together with other elements of Smith's moral theory, McHugh suggests that Smith shares a phenomenology of moral experience with rationalists like Samuel Clarke: both see moral obligations as "intrinsically compelling as soon as they are recognized." (294) But for Smith as for Kant, the appearance of objectivity here derives from features we share with other human subjects rather than from moral facts "out in the world," as seems to be the case for Clarke (296). What we share with other human subjects for Smith is, however, not pure reason, but our desire to act, and feel, in ways of which others will approve, and thereby to achieve self-approval. So, for Smith as for Kant, we seek a certain "consistency or coherence" with the judgments of other human beings (297), but for Smith that consistency is a sentimental rather than a rational one.

It seems to me that McHugh is very much on the right track here. The one point I'd like to add is that Smith's appeal to the motivating power of reason comes in the context of one of the several occasions on which he notes that we are "but one of the multitude, in no respect better than any other in it." So what reason seems to inform us of is that we have the same value as every other human being and should not exempt ourselves from the norms to which we hold others. But this is very much the content, also, of the categorical imperative. Even if Smith's explicit account of reason in TMS may not be useful for explicating its finger-losing passage, then, he draws our attention in that passage to a feature of reason that closely resembles the one that Kant stressed. Of course, he goes on to say that we heed reason out of our love of self-approval. Kant would not agree with that. But what we are heeding may yet be quite Kantian, and not just in the phenomenological way that McHugh so beautifully explains.

Kant admired and responded to his Scottish contemporaries and forebears in many ways. This collection brings that out superbly, and will, I hope and expect, be a launching pad for much future research.