Kant and the Subject of Critique: On the Regulative Role of the Psychological Idea

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Avery Goldman, Kant and the Subject of Critique: On the Regulative Role of the Psychological Idea, Indiana University Press, 2012, 249pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253223661.

Reviewed by Rachel Zuckert, Northwestern University


Avery Goldman's book is ambitious, thought-provoking, difficult, and controversial. Goldman raises numerous questions concerning Kant's method and premises, or, in his terms, questions of "metacritique." Following Hegel, Goldman asks whether, in arguing that human reason should be limited to knowledge of objects of experience, Kant does not himself transcend those limits. Following Hamann -- the originator of the term, "metacritique" -- and Heidegger, Goldman asks how Kant can justify his distinction between objects of experience and objects that are not experienced (why does intellection not count as experience?), or his understanding of experience as comprising encounters with spatial objects, or his claim that human cognition is produced by the interaction of understanding and sensibility. Or, generally: what is the status of Kant's claims concerning human cognitive faculties -- understanding, sensibility, reason, and so forth (or what Goldman, like others, calls Kant's "transcendental psychology")? Does Kant's critical investigation of the possibility of metaphysics presuppose, in fact, metaphysical claims concerning the nature of the subject?

Goldman argues that these challenging questions are all to be answered by understanding Kant's philosophical activity to comprise transcendental reflection, guided by the a priori idea of the soul as a regulative principle. That is: as described in the Amphiboly chapter of the first Critique, transcendental reflection is the activity of considering one's representations and the cognitive faculties that produce them. Like the forms of reflective judgment discussed in the third Critique, Goldman argues, such reflection must be guided by a principle that delineates its subject matter and guides investigation of it. For critical (transcendental) reflection, this guidance is provided by the rational idea of the soul -- as simple, persistent substance -- discussed in the Paralogisms chapter of the first Critique. Kant argues that those who aspire to generate substantive a priori claims concerning such a soul (rational psychologists) are bound to fail, for such knowledge transcends human cognitive capacities. But, he argues in the Appendix to the Dialectic, this idea may nonetheless guide us in our attempts to gain systematic empirical knowledge of human psychology.

Goldman -- controversially -- argues that this claim may be understood not simply to concern proper method in empirical research, but also Kant's own philosophical activity. Thus Kant can be understood to explain the status of his own claims: they are reflective judgments guided by this idea of the soul, which establishes the basic character of the knowing subject and the realm of its experienced objects (as spatial, as distinct from it). This idea does, as the Hegelian objection contends, transcend experience -- or, as Heidegger would have it, is metaphysical: it is an idea of reason, developed, Kant claims, by attempting to find the ultimate conditions for all conditioned items, including experience itself. But Kant accounts for this metaphysics, this transcendence of experience: the formation of the rational ideas, and then the failure to generate legitimate knowledge claims concerning them are part of reason's self-diagnosis, its recognition that when it attempts to transcend experience, it becomes enmeshed in fallacy and self-contradiction. Used merely regulatively, the idea of the soul may guide us, however, in identifying the conditions and nature of experience (from beyond experience), without itself constituting a metaphysical knowledge claim that would violate Kant's limitations on human capacities for knowledge.

As should be clear, Goldman's book is indeed ambitious. It includes considerable discussion of the post-Kantian German philosophical tradition, as well as of a wide range of scholarship, particularly German and French-language sources. Goldman acknowledges the central influence of Heidegger in particular, as the source not only for many of the guiding questions of his study, but also even for the book's (not always perspicuous) organization (111). (Unusually for a Heideggerean interpreter, however, Goldman does not focus on time or the imagination; thus the book provides a fresh sense of Heidegger's contribution to Kant studies.) Goldman also discusses a wide range of Kantian texts, from Dreams of a Spirit Seer to the Opus Postumum, proposing original (and controversial) interpretations not just of the first Critique project, but also of specific texts such as the "Refutation of Idealism" and §76 of the Critique of Judgment.

No review can, therefore, address everything in this complex book; nor, in any case, am I confident that I have understood all of the dense and difficult discussions in it. I shall, therefore, restrict myself to discussing Goldman's overarching contention -- again, that Kant's philosophical activity should be understood as transcendental reflection, "oriented" by the rational-psychological idea of the soul -- as responding to just one of the metacritical questions he raises. Namely: What sort of claims are Kant's transcendental-psychological claims? This is an important question, and it is the one that seems most directly to be answered by Goldman's interpretive proposal; focusing on it can, then, highlight the ways in which Goldman's interpretation is worthy of discussion -- original, interesting, important, if also in some ways problematic.

The question concerning the status of Kant's transcendental psychological claims arguably lies at the heart of the critical project. For critique, Kant claims, is precisely the investigation of human cognitive capabilities, in order to determine the scope of human knowledge. This question is also one to which, one might think, there are only two, rather unappealing answers: empirical psychology or rational psychology. If Kant's claims concerning the cognitive faculties are rational psychology, then he would appear to be dogmatic (and hypocritical), in making substantive a priori claims without the justification he demands for such claims (at least when proposed by others). If these claims are empirical, on the other hand, it would seem that he is engaged in a version of "armchair" empirical investigation, making assertions that may be confirmed or disconfirmed by on-going empirical research -- hardly establishing the future of any possible metaphysics, as Kant famously claims to do. They would also appear to be claims the legitimacy or objectivity of which is to be established by the arguments of critique itself, i.e., its explanation of the legitimacy and possibility of human knowledge claims. Thus -- the metacritic objects -- Kantian critique would seem to presuppose either claims that it will deem illegitimate (metaphysics) or those that it will claim to render legitimate (empirical knowledge), either to contradict itself, or to beg the question. (This problem is akin to that old chestnut among metacritical questions, not discussed by Goldman, namely the question whether Kant's claims are synthetic a priori.) And, under rationalist dogmatism, Goldman also includes a possible answer to this metacritical question proposed by commentators including W.H. Walsh and Lewis White Beck: it is also not legitimate to suggest that the character of human cognition or of experience might be self-evident or given (a position Goldman calls “naturalizing” Kantian epistemology, a move he takes to be contrary to Kant’s claims that we know ourselves also only as we appear).

Goldman's suggestion that Kant's claims may be understood as reflective judgments is an ingenious response to this dilemma. If it is problematic to understand Kant's claims of transcendental psychology as either a priori or empirical knowledge claims, one may avoid this problem by taking them not to be claims to knowledge at all. (Or in Heideggerean terms: if Kant seems to presuppose a metaphysics of the subject so as to examine metaphysics, one may, in Kant's defense, take this presupposition to be merely regulative, not fully, assertorically, metaphysics.) That is: though many scholars take it that Kant's claims are products of transcendental reflection, Goldman goes farther than most in assimilating such reflection to the reflective judgments discussed in the third Critique, which do not have objective validity, do not provide knowledge of their objects, but are simply ways that we must think of those objects. Thus, on Goldman's view, Kant neither engages in rational psychology (dogmatic metaphysics), nor (here) in empirical psychology, for he is merely as it were sketching a conception of the subject that guides investigation, not making assertions about it. Kant himself provides accounts of what it is so to sketch -- in his discussions of regulative principles and reflective judgment -- and thus not only can consistently account for his philosophical activity, but has done so.

This proposal may well, however, leave the meta-critic unsatisfied. For it appears that Kant, on Goldman's portrayal, just admits that his claims are not justified (are not knowledge, or are based on an ungrounded, hypothetically presupposed, not really acknowledged metaphysics). Goldman recognizes that on his view "the critical system cannot answer the metacritical demand for an objective justification of the criteria [or the conceptions of human cognitive faculties] with which it begins its analysis" (180; see also Chapter Four, where Goldman claims to show that answering this sort of metacritical question is impossible for Kant). Rather, he continues,

Kant accepts the radically skeptical notion that our conceptual vocabulary is forever limited to our subjective viewpoint, limited to the criteria of analysis that we have chosen, and forever lacking the external criteria that would offer it metaphysical certainty. However, within this 'abyss' the circular method of the critical inquiry offers a conceptually non-contradictory system that provides far-ranging insight into a wide variety of human concerns. (180)

Here Goldman recognizes that taking Kant's claims to be reflective judgments might render his account "non-contradictory" (he thereby does not pretend to metaphysical knowledge of the human mind, which he denies any human being can have), and allocates a place in his system to such claims (as reflective judgments). But this move does not justify these claims. Moreover, and this is a claim Goldman develops extensively (but one that cannot be discussed here), such an understanding of Kant's starting points -- his basic claims concerning human cognition -- can be attained only once the argument of the entire Critique is complete, and thus only on the basis of argumentation that has employed those very starting points. Hence Goldman's reference to Kant's "circular method."

Goldman suggests, then, that on his interpretation Kant can be justified to Kantians (who share his "subjective viewpoint") but not to anyone else. I shall return to this (rather disappointing) conclusion briefly below, but note first that even Kantians might want to hear more. Goldman's textual evidence is, one might note first, rather thin: Kant never explicitly asserts that his philosophical activity -- or any a priori inquiry (as opposed to empirical investigation) -- is guided by the idea of the soul, and in fact discusses the regulative function of this idea very sparingly, as Goldman notes. Goldman's interpretations often seem, accordingly, rather speculative. But if his proposal can help Kant respond to this important metacritical question satisfactorily, then it could well be accepted as a good reconstruction. But can it? Kant himself argues that reflective judgments (notably, but not exclusively, aesthetic judgments) too require justification, in order to demonstrate their intersubjective, if not objective, validity: to show that even though they do not provide knowledge of objects, they are not arbitrary or merely subjective -- not merely the ones we happen to have "chosen" in Goldman's terms -- but rather constitute claims that may count as valid for all human beings. True to the above-quoted passage, however, Goldman does not tell us how Kant's claims concerning human cognitive capabilities might be justified on his view. It is in fact hard to know how they could be, since all of Kant's own justificatory arguments rely, precisely, on claims concerning human cognition (here a vicious circle would seem to threaten).

In the above-quoted passage, Goldman suggests another justification for his Kantian reflective judgments, namely that they bring us insight into human concerns. This suggestion is promising, particularly as a justification for (judgment in accord with) a regulative principle, which does not provide knowledge itself, but could be justified by reference to the (other) knowledge claims it makes possible. But it also raises another concern a Kantian might have about this interpretation: Goldman does not much spell out how the idea of the soul could orient critical reflection, how it, a relatively empty, indeterminate idea, in fact might help to generate insights concerning human cognition.

Perhaps, as Kant claims, and as Goldman emphasizes, this idea could differentiate inner sense from "outer" (spatial) objects (though here one might wonder where time fits in). But how does this conception of the soul guide us to think of the understanding and sensibility as distinct faculties? Or of human experience as sensible, by contrast to ideas that are merely thought? Kant himself suggests that this idea guides us to try to attribute the various faculties we discover in empirical psychological investigation to a single power (A682/B710) -- and one can see how the idea of the soul (as simple) might do that. It is less clear how it can guide us in generating the basic distinctions of transcendental psychology with which Goldman is concerned, how it could explain where the content of such claims comes from, particularly if one understands such inquiry to be a priori, as Goldman appears to (though this is not entirely clear, since he emphasizes that the inquiry concerns the subject as it appears in inner sense, which might suggest that these claims are empirical on his view).

These questions -- whence the justification and content of Kant's transcendental psychological claims -- are difficult. The metacritical questions in general are among the most intractable about Kant; it is unclear how best to respond to them, and Goldman's attempt to do so is intelligent and serious. I am myself tempted to think that with respect to transcendental psychology, there might be other ways to understand such claims, "missing alternatives" (to empirical or rational psychology) not addressed by Goldman: reflection understood as knowledge of ourselves as subjects or agents, rather than objects, of inquiry -- or (a Hegelian proposal) taking such claims to arise out of the history of reflection on human cognition in the philosophical tradition.

But I would also suggest that the sort of approach Goldman dismisses as dogmatic -- that of Walsh, Beck, or (for that matter) neo-Kantians or phenomenologists working in Kant's wake -- might be more promising than that proposed in this book. Such thinkers do take (Kant to be taking) something as "given" -- experience, representations, the character of cognitive activities -- from which the justification and content of Kant's basic claims arise. They thus do open Kant up to metacritical objections according to "external criteria," namely the adequacy of his characterizations, in light of readers' awareness of their own cognitive activity or experience. In other words, they render Kant's thought refutable (or confirmable), not a closed system immune to objections at the price of self-referentiality or arbitrariness. Such "external criteria" do not, indeed, offer "metaphysical certainty": it is contingent, on Kant's view, that we are the kind of knowers that we are. But this sort of view might render his system one able to offer insights concerning human concerns transcending its own terms, one offering (as it were) a reflective account of our pre-reflective experience that might -- in principle, one hopes -- be accessible to all.