Kant and the Unity of Reason

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Angelica Nuzzo, Kant and the Unity of Reason, Purdue University Press, 2005, 398pp, $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 1557531889.

Reviewed by Cinzia Ferrini, University of Trieste


The Purdue University Press series in the history of philosophy aims to present the core ideas of a major philosopher's thought by providing an up-to-date running commentary on a text of particular significance, in the present case, the published Introduction to Kant's Critique of Judgment. Part I (chapters 1-4) recounts the development of Kant's thought up to the third Critique. Part II (chapters 5-8, pages 85-258), the book's core, presents Kant's text in German and in a new, very literal (XV) English translation on facing pages, together with a detailed interpretive commentary. Part III (chapters 9-14) reconstructs Kant's main arguments in the third Critique, "adhering to his line" (261). A useful tool in courses and seminars is also the extensive bibliography (369-387), listing secondary literature in English, German, French, and Italian.

The chapters of Part III are distributed between the "Analytic of the Aesthetic Faculty of Judgment" (ch. 9-11) and the "Analytic of the Teleological Faculty of Judgment" (ch. 12-14). The third Critique is presented as "the latest result" of Kant's "life-long philosophical experimentation" on "sensibility (as intuition, perception, feeling, drive etc.)," in the effort "to find the a priori of its forms implicated in the activity of the different faculties of the mind" (76-77). "Only very late" did Kant become "convinced of the possibility of discovering an a priori principle for our faculty of judgment and of seeing in the notion of purposiveness the unifying principle" of the aesthetic and teleological approach to nature (17). Kant's task was "to draw the limits of the sphere of experience that belongs to reflective judgment on the one hand and to provide the transcendental foundation or justification for this sphere on the other" (94).

The rationale of the title rests on Kant's attempt to think of the "unity" of the physical body and moral soul of the human being despite the fundamental dualism of nature and freedom stated in the first two Critiques. Within this frame, the function of the third faculty of Urteilskraft is to assure "the possibility of a transition or mediation," not between two totally separate worlds, but between "two 'ways of thinking' human experience" (125). Only by recognizing reflective judgment "as the force responsible for the meaningfulness" of what is empirical and contingent in human experience "does experience as a coherent system become possible for the first time" (89). The author expressly builds on the "theoretical heart" of the Critique of Judgment, which alone affords a philosophical reconstruction of "the system of the three critiques" (63).

Thus, the author aims at showing the continuity between the latter two sections of her work and Part I of the book, the goal of which is to indicate both Kant's "way to" the Critique of Judgment, i.e. his complex itinerary towards it, and the indispensability of its internal contextualization (against the background of the first two critiques; 64). From the standpoint of the unitary way in which reason works in the theoretical and practical field, the "new" fields of our feelings for the beauty of nature, art, and the phenomenon of life, show why reason must relate to nature in ways free of any constitutive cognitive or moral aim. This requires investigating the sphere of empirical knowledge of contingent natural objects to answer "the question of whether a peculiar type of lawfulness could still be detected" which is neither the understanding's order of efficient causality (129) nor reason's legislative function in its moral domain.

To set the proper context for answering this question, Part I first provides a synthetic account of the development of Kant's thought, from the pre-critical period to the Opus postumum (chapter 1). Second, it details Kant's appraisal of our cognitive faculty in the first Critique (chapter 2). Third, it connects Kant's thesis that pure reason is practical with sensibility, as analyzed in chapter two (chapter 3). Chapter Four first provides an "indirect introduction" to the problematic of the Critique of Judgment, and then examines some interpretive approaches. The author criticizes readings that separate the two parts of Kant's third Critique or that reject as confused Kant's own effort to integrate these two parts by analyzing them as two forms of the reflective faculty of judgment. Finally, the chapter focuses on the genesis and the internal development of the text of the third Critique.

As a typical example of the methodology and aims of this volume, consider the author's account of the core ideas of Kant's Theory of the Heavens (1755), retracing the beginning of a problematic that later underlies the systematic necessity of finding a mediating link between theoretical and practical philosophy: "Taking up Newton's theories, Kant presents a mechanistic reconstruction of the origins of the universe. In the preface, he addresses the problem of the conciliation between mechanism and teleology, science and faith" (5). The author then focuses on the necessary link envisaged by Kant between intellectual, moral capacities and the physical characteristics of other possible inhabitants of the solar system. Later, the author refers to this pre-critical work when quoting §75 of the third Critique: "Repeating a claim that goes back to his 1755 Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens, Kant states: 'So certain is this that we may boldly state that it is absurd for human beings even to … hope that perhaps some day another Newton may arise who would explain to us, in terms of natural laws unordered by intention, how even a mere blade of grass is produced" (342).

The author's presentation deserves some further elucidation, regarding both Kant's "taking up" Newton's theories and his "repeating" a pre-critical claim in 1790. Consider five points briefly. First, Kant proposed extending Newtonian attraction (which Newton restricted to terrestrial mechanics and our solar system) to the entire universe. Second, he rejected Newton's view that the planetary order was arranged by the immediate hand of God, without the intervention of the force of nature (Ak. 1:221.5-9; 2:108-112). Third, when Kant reconstructs the natural processes by which matter forms bodies and organized systems of bodies in terms of the blind mechanism of its own forces, that is, the sheer interplay between attraction and repulsion, he claims "to borrow" them from the Newtonian Weltweisheit, but Kant also underscores the unsatisfactory epistemological status and circumscribed use of the Newtonian repulsive force (Ak. 1:234.33-235.2). Fourth, when Kant accounts for a self-organizing matter that puts itself in a revolving state by attraction and repulsion, at the same time he remarks that Newtonian attraction alone is insufficient for explaining the beginning of the formation of the planets, for in the case of a particle of such exceptional fineness, gravitational force would be far too slow and feeble (Ak. 1:267.34-36, 268.27-31). Fifth, Kant expresses the law of universal gravitation as based on an inference from phenomena, on the basis of Newton's "deduction from the phenomena" in Book III of the Principia; moreover, he views the Newtonian method as proceeding regressively and as based upon experience and geometry. In sharp contrast, Kant's aim was to discover the systematicity (das Systematische) that binds together the great members of the creation from the primitive state of nature by mechanical laws (Ak. 1:221.5-9).

However, Kant noted that accounting for the heavens as a systematic totality brought about by nature's (blind) mechanism is not an approach that can account for the formation of living organisms. In 1755 Kant distinguished between heavenly and organic bodies by way of their degree of intelligibility for us: our understanding relates differently, and with much more difficulty, to organic bodies. According to Kant, we may easily understand the origin of the system of the world and the generation of the heavenly bodies because of 1) the roundness of the masses, which is the simplest of their forms, 2) the circularity of their motion, due to the simple combination of repulsion and attraction, and 3) the huge empty space that separates the bodies, allowing for their distinct and clear observation. "But can we boast of the same progress even regarding the lowest plant or an insect? Are we in a position to say: 'Give me matter, and I will show you how a caterpillar can be produced'? Are we not arrested here at the first step, from ignorance of the real inner conditions of the object and the complication of the manifold constituents existing in it?" (Ak. 1:230.14-20).

Clearly at this time Kant did not regard the intelligibility of the production of even a very simple organism by conceiving its parts as effects of mechanical causes, to be ordered under a general principle, as something absurd (ungereimt), as he wrote in the third Critique (1790). In the Heavens (1755) Kant regarded such an explanation only as highly problematic, given the subjective limits of our observation and the objective complications of the subject matter, namely organic life. The distinct and complete mechanical explanation of a single herb or a caterpillar is neither excluded on an empirical basis nor taken as impossible (and thus as "absurd"). Rather, Kant projects such an explanation into a vague and distant future, by claiming that the origin of the whole present constitution of the cosmos will become intelligible before (eher) the production of a simple plant or animal by mechanical causes will become fully understood (Ak. 1:230.21-26). Only when Kant develops the view (Critique of Judgment, §75) that organism has a meaning of its own, irreducible to that of mechanism, does he clearly state that one must absolutely deny (de jure) that some day another Newton might arise who would explain to us (in terms of natural laws unordered by any intention) how even a mere blade of grass is produced.

Taking the difference between Kant's statements from 1755 and 1790 into proper account (Kant's 1755 statement is mentioned on p. 67, though in a different connection) would likely have allowed the author to notice that in Kant's argument against physico-theology in "The Only Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God" (1763), Kant appears for the first time to regard the formation of organic products as an effect to which mechanical causes surely contribute, though for which they are not sufficient. Regarding this work, the author briefly recounts Kant's new ontological argument for the existence of God, without mentioning his criticism of the physico-theological proof (6). However, in this text Kant discusses the very origin of an organism, writing that "it is absurd (ungereimt)" to regard the initial generation of a plant or an animal as a mechanical "side effect" of the universal laws of nature (Ak. 2:114.17-19); these laws are necessary, but by no means sufficient, to account for life. Moreover, our lack of success in making the natural causes of the generation and the inner structure of objects clear according to mechanical laws concerns not only plants and animals; Kant notes that mechanical laws do not explain the six-pointed star of the snowflakes (cf. Ak. 2:114.5-6). Our lack of success in discovering general causes of the generation of snowflakes and of organisms is rooted in the very reasons for our success in explaining the arrangement of the universe by means of the universal laws of nature: the heavenly bodies "are round masses without (ohne) organization and secret 'technical' preparation (geheime Kunstzubereitung)" (Ak. 2:137).

Furthermore, Kant mentions the formation of crystals in §VI of the First Introduction to the Critique of Judgment, in connection with natural products which exist as systems (als Systeme). Kant distinguishes between what we see as mere aggregates and natural forms endowed with absolute purposiveness, by which he understands "such an external shape as well as inner structure that are so constituted that their possibility must be grounded in an idea of them in our power of judgment" (Ak. 20:217). In such cases, nature freely proceeds technically; this is to say, nature's causality in respect to the form of its products as ends is not just a mechanical one, for at the same time it is in analogy with art (Kunst). In terms of the First Introduction, also inorganic crystal formations are intrinsically systematic, as are the shapes of flowers and the inner structure of plants and animals, because the arrangement of their parts differs from the way in which we regard soils, stones or minerals, which are viewed as mere aggregates. In Kant's Critical period, the systematicity of empirical phenomena is no longer comprehensible due to the origin of their essential properties in the design of God's infinite Understanding. In any event, Kant now holds that the ground of nature's inner purposiveness is "beyond the sphere of the insights into nature that are possible for us" (Ak. 20:218). Nevertheless, the systematicity of empirical phenomena is comprehended through the necessary presupposition of a systematic interconnection of empirical laws that in truth is reflectively grounded on the technique of nature. This is the major novelty that emerges from Kant's 1790 texts, once it is noticed that by 1763 Kant was aware of the limits of mechanical explanations of the structure of some inorganic natural products and, in contrast to heavenly bodies, he in fact ascribed to organized beings a geheime Kunstzubereitung. The novelty, therefore, does not imply a "new definition of nature" (124), as the author holds, by contrasting Kant's view in the third Critique that nature acts in a technical way to the "mechanistic" natura formaliter spectata of the first Critique.

The author contends that the first Critique explores a "mechanistic 'nature in general'" (124). However, a major change occurs in the second (B) edition of 1787. As Marcucci already noted, in the B edition the central laws of motion of heavenly bodies are now grounded transcendentally, in so far as they give "complete certainty" to the Copernican hypothesis and demonstrate the invisible force (Newton's force of attraction) that binds together the world-edifice, making a system of it (Ak 3:xxiii). Now, the source of the unity of the universe can be grounded only on a rational basis. The author's brief sketch of Kant's Opus postumum (20-21) omits Kant's expressed view that the moving force of Newtonian attraction is a cause immediately produced by the body itself, not by the communication of motion from one body to another; this is to say, Kant understands gravity in "dynamical" not "mechanical" terms (Ak. 23:528f.). As has been highlighted by Friedman, in the Metaphysical Foundations Kant explicitly reproached Newton for denying that gravitation is essential to and inherent in matter.

Returning to the third Critique, it is worth noting that the points made in §VI of the First Introduction are also stated, though more indirectly, in §58 of the published text, as has been highlighted, e.g., by Brandt, Carrier, Jones, Lequan, and Zumbach. In §58 Kant explains the formation of crystals as a special case of free natural formation from matter fully dissolved in a fluid at rest, resulting from the evaporation or separation of a part of it (sometimes merely of the caloric). Determinate figure or texture forms upon solidification through cooling (Kant provides the example of the straight raylets of ice in freezing water). Solidification through precipitation takes place as it were through a leap from fluid to solid state. What is, on my view, important to notice here, is that within this account of the inorganic formation of mineral crystallizations, Kant indicates a continuity (through the notion of systematic organization of the parts) between the inorganic and the organic, thus hinting at a material tendency, an original predisposition to self-forming, by ascribing to plants and animals the anti-corpuscular, Leibnizian primacy of fluidity over rigidity.

The author's account of §58 (313, 317-318) provides an analysis of the notion of purposiveness that moves from the first aesthetic towards the second teleological part of the third Critique and its criticism of a realism of teleology. Her account focuses only on Kant's idea "of nature's freedom in the Bildung of beautiful forms and figures" and on the closeness of nature's production of beauty to the genius' creation through aesthetic ideas. In the Analytic of the Teleological Faculty of Judgment, Kant discusses self-producing and self-regulating beings. Failure to notice Kant's bridge between inorganic and organic phenomena, represented by the notion of natural form as systematic self-organization, apparently leads to incaution about identifying, as the author does, these self-producing and self-regulating beings simply with "organisms and living beings" (330, 333). This, together with omission of Kant's dynamical view of the internal organizational tendency of matter (involving the key role of chemical affinity in the mixture of matters that is crucial for the formation of masses and bodies), prevents the author from including within "the unity of reason" Kant's idea of a world system of inorganic and organic formations, and therefore his very conception of the systematicity of nature as a whole.