Kant, Foucault, and Forms of Experience

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Marc Djaballah, Kant, Foucault, and Forms of Experience, Routledge, 2008, 348pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415956246.

Reviewed by Johanna Oksala, University of Dundee


In this erudite study, Marc Djaballah analyses the specific character of Foucault's Kantianism. Despite the title suggesting that equal weight is given to Kant and Foucault, the book is primarily a contribution to Foucault scholarship attempting to show the extent of Foucault's proximity and debt to Kant. The main argument about their relationship takes the form of a structural reconstruction: Djaballah argues that the formal structure of their discursive practice -- the practice of criticism -- is the same. He analyses Foucault's Kantianism in formal terms by identifying his historical studies as an exercise of Kantian criticism.

The level of scholarship in Djaballah's book is exemplary: it is based on a wide reading of original French sources including archival material. All the English citations are Djaballah's own careful translations.

Foucault's relationship to Kant is an important and timely topic that has received surprisingly little attention. Foucault's relationship to Nietzsche has been analysed repeatedly and even his cursory remarks about the importance of Heidegger have spawned a host of articles, but the scholarly treatment of his Kantianism has been sparse. Yet, it is beyond doubt that Kant was a central figure for Foucault. One of his earliest publications was a translation of Kant's lectures on anthropology including an extensive introductory monograph. In his late essays on the Enlightenment Foucault presented his whole project as a version of Kantianism -- an ontology of the present.

Djaballah notes that the enigmatic character of Foucault's Kantianism can be attributed to the fact that his explicit assessments of Kant seem to be incoherent and consist of a series of puzzling remarks and discussions scattered throughout his writings. Djaballah's research is extremely thorough in identifying these textual occasions, and he offers insightful comments and provides important context for them. He analyses both the early and late discussions of Kant in Foucault's books, essays and interviews -- most notably Les mots et les choses and the Enlightenment essays. He shows that Foucault's turn to Kant in his late work seems less sudden if we take into account his extensive engagement with Kant throughout his writing. Djaballah notes how in an interview with George Steiner in 1971, for example, Foucault associates his concept of archaeology with Kant's use of the term in a 1793 essay "Fortschritte der Metaphysik" clearly stating an allegiance already at that time. The references to Kant in the 1960s essays on literature show that Kant was an important influence also in the early philosophical analysis of literary discourse.

Djaballah makes clear, however, that his study of Kant and Foucault does not aim at textual commentary on Foucault's explicit references to Kant. His approach is strictly formal. The objective is a comparison of Kant's and Foucault's theoretical structures of thought that demonstrates their formal affinity.

While all of these perplexities deserve to be considered extensively, the prior problem examined here concerns the form of Foucault's discourse itself. Rather than a point of intervention of Kant in Foucault's work, in other words, it attempts to unify formal aspects of Kant's criticism in relation to those of Foucault's historical analysis around a shared practice of criticism. The relation is drawn not in terms of their projects and shared methods, but in terms of their discursive practice, the form of thinking that regulates their works. (p. 13)

It is this structural framing of the project that I find problematic. The study addresses Kant's theoretical writings and Foucault's historical studies as "exercises of a single form of thinking" and "as a type of discourse regulated by a discursive practice regulated by a number of specifiable conceptual factors" (p. 14). Forcing the theoretical apparatuses of two philosophers under a single form would be a difficult undertaking in most cases, and it seems particularly problematic in the case of two such original thinkers as Kant and Foucault separated by two centuries.

Djaballah argues that transposing the topic at this formal level of consideration has a number of advantages. Foucault's conceptual proximity to Kant can be articulated directly, unobscured by the question of influence. Whereas Foucault's characterizations of his own understanding of his relation to Kant may seem inconsistent and ideologically suspect, the proximity in terms of form, in terms of the rules of the way of thinking functioning in their work, is stable (Ibid.).

While analysing Foucault's Kantianism strictly formally might appear profoundly Foucauldian in the sense that it undercuts the relation of influence and the authority of an author's self-understanding, it also has a number of disadvantages. It is profoundly unfoucauldian in forcing his thought under a single form. The understanding of Foucault's thought as a toolbox, a flexible and varied discursive practice drawing from a multiplicity of sources, is undermined. Leaving aside questions of faithfulness, however, the most serious problem with this focus on formal similarities is that it produces a lot of either very general parallels or extremely contrived connections while making interesting thematic and methodological affinities marginal.

Djaballah begins the project in the first and longest chapter of the book by analysing Kant's theoretical writings. He defines the practice of Kantian criticism in its original version by five capacities or "regulative segments": the capacity to abstract, the need for an exercise of scepticism, a functional understanding of the capacities of thought, the submersion of experience in thought and the distinction between real and possible as a background to the definition of the aim of philosophy. The ensuing chapters then address aspects of the relation between Kant and Foucault in terms of these segments.

Chapter two draws a parallel between the distancing shock required for Kant's critical reasoning -- Hume's rude awakening of his thought from its dogmatic slumber -- and the similar moment of estrangement in Foucault's practice of criticism required to alert one to the historical contingency of one's present. The same parallel could, however, be drawn between Foucault and a number of other thinkers, both before and after Kant -- Descartes, Merleau-Ponty, Wittgenstein, just to name a few. The specificity of Kant and his form of philosophical criticism is further undermined by the fact that most of the chapter is devoted to a discussion of estrangement as Nietzsche's sceptical method. The last chapter attempts to cast Foucault's literary essays in a Kantian form by arguing that the function of literature in Foucault mirrors space and time as forms of receptivity in Kant. Djaballah explains that "the technical concept of literature in Foucault's writings, formally situated as the particular form of receptivity functional in Foucault's analysis of historical practices", marks the reorientation of Kantian criticism in his thought (p. 22).

The most promising structural parallel is discussed in chapter four 'Practices as Forms of Experience' in which Djaballah considers Foucault's and Kant's forms of experience. The question of Foucault's relationship to transcendental philosophy has been intensely debated by commentators, especially since the publication of Beatrice Han's definitive book L'ontologie manquée de Michel Foucault (1998). Transcendental readings of Foucault have argued that his work could be viewed as an attempt to renew transcendental philosophy in the sense that he too aims to study the conditions of possibility for experience. While for Kant the aim was to establish the necessary and universal conditions for all possible experience, Foucault attempted to find the historically and culturally contingent conditions of real and local experiences. Because experiences are always constituted in historically changing practices incorporating power relations their form cannot be understood as universal or necessary. Experience -- whether delinquent, feminine or perverse -- is the effect of normalization, in other words, it is constituted in normative cultural practices.

Djaballah appears to defend such a transcendental reading of Foucault when he emphasizes that forms of experience in Foucault correspond to types of practices, and the structure of a practice defines the form of experience it generates (p. 222). The way he ultimately relates the forms of questioning in Kant and Foucault is distinctly different, however: he superimposes forms of experience and practices in Foucault's thought. He argues that Foucault's basic items of description are practices, which are essentially unified forms of experience. Foucault "understands history in terms of a succession of practices or forms of experience" and the forms of experience that he analyses "are textual, and not sensible experiences" (p. 238). Djaballah contends that understanding practices as forms of experience in Foucault's analysis makes it possible to appreciate the structural similarity between practices in Foucault's analysis, and the form of experience in Kant (p. 237). The formal affinity between Foucault and Kant is thus drawn between two transcendentally different levels -- the constituting practices and the constituting experience. Thus conceived, Foucault's studies

lend themselves to reconstruction on a rigorously Kantian model. Similar to Kant's experience of the real, Foucault's practices necessarily have both spontaneous and receptive components. Like the formal component of experience in Kant, these forms in Foucault's studies function as ontologically coextensive with the practices they are supposed to structure. (p. 222)

While superimposing practices and the forms of experience they generate might provide "a renewed standpoint on the structural similarity" between Kant and Foucault, it is not helpful in attempting to understand Foucault's conception of experience. A distinction must be drawn between discourse and experience, even given the understanding that discourse is the prior condition for the intelligibility of experience. The forms of experience that Foucault analyses are undoubtedly textual in the sense that all experience becomes textual when it is analysed philosophically. But even if we accept that experience is always linguistically structured, experience and discourse cannot be simply understood as co-extensive. Failing to make a distinction between structured practices and the subjective experiences they form means failing to account for the constitution of the subject and consequently for such key ideas as normalization, subversion and practices of the self. As Djaballah notes (pp. 220-21), during the 1984 study sessions at Berkley Foucault defined practice as a type of normative behaviour, "a mode of both acting and thinking". Practices were central for his analyses because they provided "the key for the intelligibility of the correlative constitution of the subject and the object". By identifying practices with forms of experience it becomes difficult to understand this correlative constitution in any way. Turning Foucault into a discursive idealist also ignores his axial definition of experience as "the correlation, in a culture, between domains of knowledge, types of normativity and forms of subjectivity".[1] In sum, instead of reading Foucault's Kantianism as form of transcendental philosophy that studies the historical constitution of experience, Djaballah reads Foucault as a Kantian structuralist.

Djaballah writes of Foucault's Les mot et les choses that the impenetrability of its style of expression can conceal the precision of its analysis and the wealth of its insight (p. 7). Something similar could be said of Djaballah's book. Stylistically the book is extremely dense and weighted down by sentences that are needlessly long and convoluted:

It is in particular important to appreciate the logic of Kant's rejection of the traditional philosophical devalorization of sensibility at the hands of understanding in the context of this reconstruction of Kant's conception of cognitive experience, in the development of which it had a decisive role. (p. 71)

While following the movement of Djaballah's thought thus requires considerable effort, at times it is, nevertheless, ultimately a rewarding task. There is a lot to be learned from his detailed and thorough study. While Foucault's readings of Kant might not provide a coherent, cohesive outlook, Djaballah's comprehensive charting of these texts is in itself a groundbreaking undertaking. It is this accomplishment rather than the presentation of a formal unity of Foucault's Kantianism that I find the most impressive and enjoyable aspect of the book.

[1] Michel Foucault, The Use of Pleasure, The History of Sexuality, Vol 2. London: Penguin, 1985, 4-5.