Kant: Making Reason Intuitive

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Kyriaki Goudeli, Pavlos Kontos, and Ioli Patellis (eds.), Kant: Making Reason Intuitive, Palgrave Macmillan, 2007, 256pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 0230506895.

Reviewed by Melissa Zinkin, Binghamton University


The introduction to Kant: Making Reason Intuitive states that the essays in the volume are concerned with the question that arises from Kant's dualist positions on the relation between reason and intuition in Kant's critical work, especially with how the "dictates of reason are realized in the world of phenomena."  This is indeed a central question in Kant.  In fact it is so central that it is already the topic of countless articles and books.  An essay that attempts to justify Kant's moral philosophy, for example, usually deals with the question of how these principles are applicable to the moral concerns of our everyday phenomenal selves.  Similarly, understanding the relationship between the phenomenal and the noumenal worlds and the relationship between the understanding and sensibility is central to understanding the first Critique.  Is there a more specific issue in Kant that this volume highlights?  The introduction suggests that a focus will be Kant's doctrines of the schematism, the ideal, the typic of pure practical judgment, and the symbol, and that it will thus seek to understand how, in each of Kant's Critiques, reason (or the understanding) can be intuited, or "realized."  This is a worthwhile project.  It would be useful to have a collection of essays on the various ways in Kant in which reason is somehow given an intuitable form and on the philosophical issues associated with this task.  I would think that the Critique of Judgment would figure prominently in these discussions, especially the notion of the aesthetic idea, which "seeks to approximate a presentation of concepts of reason."  I would also expect the faculty of the imagination to figure prominently, as the faculty that produces both schemata as well as aesthetic ideas and even, perhaps, exemplifications of the moral law, if not its type.

The volume meets my expectations to some extent, but not completely.  The alphabetical, rather than thematic, organization of the chapters is the first indication that the collection of essays is somewhat haphazard.  Not all of the essays speak to the theme of the volume, and their quality is uneven.  In what follows I will provide a brief review of each of the essays in the volume.  Since there are not many interconnections among them, it is better to treat each as a stand-alone piece.

It would have been useful if at some point in the volume, if not in the introduction, there were some extended discussion of Kant's doctrine of schematism; of its technical role in Kant's philosophy, the problems that it tries to solve and those that it raises.  Such a discussion would give some philosophical weight to the analyses.  It would certainly have helped the opening article by Gary Banham, "Practical Schematism, Teleology and the Unity of the Metaphysics of Morals."  Banham states that he will show how Kant uses the procedure of schematism in his practical philosophy.  However, he never really spells out what this procedure is, nor does he mention that Kant himself thought that the use of a schema in the practical philosophy was problematic and thus chose to call what functions as the schema of the moral law a "typic."  The thread in Kant's philosophy that Banham traces is an interesting one.  It connects the three formulas of the categorical imperative with the typic of pure practical judgment and then with teleology and then with the unity of the Metaphysics of Morals.  However, I think there is too much to say in too short a space.  As a result, some of the connecting arguments are sacrificed.

Caygill's essay, "The Transition problem in Kant's Opus postumum," argues that, in the Opus postumum, rather than finding a way to mediate between reason and sensibility, Kant just eliminates the sharp distinction between the two by making them both part of the same ontology of force.  According to Caygill, "not only is the object, but also the perceiving subject is fundamentally a negotiation of active and repulsive force."  Caygill astutely notes that in this way force in the Opus postumum serves the same role as the "highest principle of synthetic a priori judgments" in the Critique of Pure Reason, since it is both the condition of the possibility of experience and the condition of the possibility of objects of experience.  I think it would have been possible for Caygill to go even one step further (and to make explicit the connection between his essay and the theme of the anthology) and to say that in the Opus postumum reason is made intuitive, since as the ground of knowledge, force is rational, while as the fundamental object of knowledge, it is sensible.

It is hard to see at first how Faraklas's discussion of gender and marriage in Kant and Fichte in his essay, "Self-Submission and Mutual Domination: Constructions of Marriage and Gender in Kant and Fichte," relates to the theme of the anthology.  Faraklas's idea seems to be that, since freedom, and hence reason, is enacted in relationships, then, in male-female relationships, we "make reason intuitive."  Faraklas makes some interesting points about Kant's and Fichte's views of sexuality and marriage, and reveals many of the contradictions in their sexism by which women are unable to attain the moral ought of rationality.  He perceptively notes that "Kant resorts to ideology" in order to justify his views of gender, whereas Fichte "deduces" an ideology.

Maximilian Forschner's thoughtful essay, "Concept and Intuition in Kant's Philosophy of Religion," shows how, in his religious philosophy, Kant makes it possible for the moral ideals that reason gives to us to be intuitable.  In the doctrine of the "saint of the Gospels" Kant offers a historical example of the ideal of human moral perfection.  In the doctrine of the true visible church, the ideal of the invisible church becomes visible.  This essay offers many insights into Kant's philosophy of religion.

Pavlos Kontos' essay, "The Categories of the Good as Categories of Moral Action," deals with the table of the categories of freedom in the Critique of Practical Reason.  There is a lot to be learned from this much overlooked section of the second Critique.  Kontos argues that the moral law becomes intuitive by being "illuminated by the categories of moral action as such."  He points out that although the typic of the moral law has the form of law, the moral law is the law of the causality of freedom.  To Kontos, this presents a conflict, since the law of causality is more material than the mere form of law, which is purely formal.  However, as I see it, for Kant, the point of having a typic of the moral law is precisely that it not be purely formal.  Kant says that the typic of the moral law is "such a law as can be presented in concreto in objects of the senses and hence a law of nature" (5:69).  Moreover, for Kant, the laws of nature are causal laws, so it makes sense for the typic to have this form.  I therefore do not find Kant's view as puzzling as does Kontos.  Nevertheless, Kontos' discussion of the categories of freedom with regard to the idea that, as categories of freedom they are also categories of causality, is helpful.

Ioli Patelli's nice paper, "Kant: Sciences, Systems and Organisms," argues that "symbols do not only have a theoretical or cognitive function but also a practical one.  They are required not only for the presentation of the idea in sensory terms, but also for its realization."  Patelli is interested in the organism considered as the symbol of the system.  He does a good job of explicating the role of the system in Kant's critical philosophy and of detailing the places in Kant's texts where it is symbolized or at least explained by analogy to the organism.  For Kant, organisms are the actualization of an end.  The ultimate end of nature is human beings themselves, and the highest end of humans is to be moral.  Nature thus has a purpose for us humans insofar as it helps us attain our highest end.  The role of the philosopher is to see how all of the sciences of knowledge relate to the moral ends of our reason.  Thus, Patelli argues, it is possible to view nature and hence the sciences as not just instrumental for the end of manipulating human beings, but also as what can promote the highest good for man, the exercise of our autonomy.

In "On the Logic of the Realization of Reason in Society and History," Kosmas Psychopedis takes on broad themes at a high level of abstraction.  He aims to discuss how, according to Kant, reason can be realized in history and society through human action and institutions.  This leads him to the discussion of the following three topics: the problem of the contingent in Kant, the problem of the "value constituted nature of reason," and the modes and types of the realization of reason in history and society.  This paper contains some interesting ideas, but the topics are too big to be treated in such a short space, and, by the end of the paper, I am not sure how they all add up.

Konstantinos Sargentis' fine article, "'Fact of Reason' and 'Natural Human Reason': On Kant's Notion of Moral Experience," makes a real contribution to the literature.  Sargentis addresses the question of what exactly constitutes our experience of the moral law and whether this experience is available only to those who have read Kant's philosophy and hence know what the categorical imperative is.  Sargentis argues that one can find in Kant a particularist philosophy, by which what is commanded in one situation is not necessarily commanded in another.  The "ought" is made particular for us each time we consider it with regard to a particular action.  Indeed, he argues that we gain knowledge of the universal moral ought "only through knowledge of the every time concrete and particular oughts."  I find this a plausible phenomenological account of the experience of morality from "below" the moral law, so to speak.  However, I wonder whether a "particular" ought can really have any normative force.  What would the reason be that would ground such an ought?  And how could such a reason just be particular?  Despite such questions, I think that evaluating Kant's theory with regard to current theories of particularism is a fruitful new way to probe the depths of Kant's moral theory.

Stelios Virvidakis' paper on "The Problem of Philosophical Knowledge in Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: How to Make Theoretical Reason Intuitive," asks how transcendental philosophy, conceived as an enterprise with cognitive aspirations, relates to experience.  It is not clear from the paper what exactly is Virvidakis' own insight into this question, which is a central question of the first Critique, and hence a lot to take on in a short essay.  Virvidakis argues that transcendental arguments can only have as a "proof" their own self-referentiality and are hence circular.  He suggests that one way that transcendental philosophy might gain a purchase on experience would be to weaken Kant's notion of the a priori.  He concludes his essay with a series of important questions about how transcendental philosophy can give us something like objective knowledge of the sensible world.  Indeed, it is precisely these questions, or even one of them, that I had hoped Virvidakis' essay would answer.

J. M. Wirth claims that there is an antinomy underlying all of Kant's work.  Given the title of his essay, "The Abject Root: Kant and the Problem of Representing Evil," I expected that this antinomy would be between good and evil.  However, the way Wirth describes this antinomy, it is unclear what he has in mind.  He writes that on the one hand "we must speak to the good, that is, we cannot, despite the relentless force of the categorical imperative, utterly avoid the realm of the anthropological.  At the same time, such speaking always betrays the good."  Here Wirth equates "the good" with "the realm of the anthropological."  Yet it seems to me that it is precisely the anthropological, empirical, nature of man that is in tension with the good will commanded by reason.  There are also other places in the essay Wirth's argument is hard to follow.  For example, he claims that the imagination, what Heidegger suggests is "the unknown root" of both sensibility and the understanding, is also the root of the stems of both reason and evil.  But this connection is not self evident, and Wirth provides no discussion linking the root of cognition to that of evil.

G. Xiropaidis' interesting article, "Negative Presentation: the Role of the Imagination in the Mathematically and the Dynamically Sublime," includes many insights, although it could benefit from a clear statement of the thesis.  At first it seems that he wants to distinguish between the beautiful and the sublime, then, it seems, his point is to distinguish the experience of the sublime from that of morality.  Despite the lack of a clear argument, Xiropaidis provides a nice analysis of the role of the imagination and time in the sublime.  He argues that in the sublime, time is broken up into many different disconnected pieces, and that in the sublime "space and time appear as infinitely indeterminate magnitudes" (I think these are consistent…).  He also provides an interesting comparison of the moral feeling of respect and the sublime and argues that, although they are related, the feeling of the sublime is not itself a moral feeling.  Unlike respect, for example, the sublime does not motivate us to act.  The connection between the imagination and respect is not always as clear as it could be.  However I agree with Xiropaidis' point that a difference between the sublime and the feeling of respect is due to the fact that one feeling is based on the imagination, whereas the other is based on reason.

This volume has something to contribute to the literature on Kant.  Unfortunately, with the exception of the papers by Caygill, Forschner, Patelli, and Sargentis, this contribution takes the form of isolated remarks, rather than strong theses and thorough argument.  Also, very few of the papers make their explicit thesis the problem of making reason intuitive.  If this were not the title of the volume, a reader would have a hard time pinpointing the theme.  Yet, each of the contributors does have something original to say, often on an underrepresented aspect of Kant's thought.  None of the articles, for example, is yet another answer to the question of the relationship between phenomena and noumena.  If one is looking for a deeper, more systematic understanding of how the ideals of reason can appear to us in our everyday empirical lives, I do not think this volume will be completely satisfying.  If, however, one wants to read some interesting essays with unique perspectives on Kant, then this book is to be recommended.