Kant on Laws

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Eric Watkins, Kant on Laws, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 297pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107163911.

Reviewed by Uygar Abaci, Pennsylvania State University


There is no question that the concept of law plays a central role in Kant's philosophy overall. In fact, one could argue that one of the paramount aims of the critical project is to establish the autonomy of the human subject in terms of her capacity to self-legislate both in theoretical and practical domains of jurisdiction. Though Kant's theories of laws of nature and the moral law have been extensively studied as distinct subjects, whether there is a univocal concept of law underlying these different kinds of laws has remained rather unexplored in the vast Kant literature. To my knowledge, Eric Watkins's book is the first book length study dedicated entirely to Kant's theory of law in general (Konstantin Pollok's Kant's Theory of Normativity [2017], deserves mention, though it focuses on the epistemic normativity of our judgments and thus falls short of the comprehensiveness that Watkins offers.)

Watkins's core argument is that Kant does indeed have a univocal concept of law that is nevertheless instantiated by various kinds of laws in different contexts of application, all of which together constitute a single and complete system of cognition, satisfying distinct demands of reason. The two essential components of Kant's most generic concept of law are "(1) necessity and (2) the act of a spontaneous faculty whose legislative authority prescribes that necessity to a specific domain through an appropriate act" (p. 2). While this concept of law brings Kant closer to the necessitarian view of laws of nature (which takes laws to be expressing necessity relations between universals or natures, as opposed to the broadly empiricist view, according to which laws are contingent but useful generalizations in our best systems of empirical inquiry into nature), Kant's view is in fact an alternative to the standard necessitarian account as it differs from it in two major respects. First, Kant allows that different kinds of necessity are involved in different particular kinds of law that all instantiate one generic concept. For instance, while "necessity" in the case of laws of nature is "determination", it is "necessitation" or "obligation" in the case of the moral law. Second, Kant grounds necessity, at least in the case of transcendental laws, in the epistemic natures of the cognitive subjects that we are, or more specifically, of our cognitive faculties, understanding and reason, instead of the natures of the objects of our cognition. For Kant construes these faculties as possessing a legislative authority and prescribing necessary rules that are laws for themselves and their respective domains of application. This is crucial, Watkins argues, for in this way Kant provides an interesting response to the challenge that the natural law tradition poses for the modern scientific idea of a law of nature literally governing inanimate objects that lack freedom and rationality (chapter 1).

Provided that Kant unequivocally states that laws are necessary or objective rules (A126; 4:469), and, likewise, that the understanding is the lawgiver of nature (A125; B164-5; 4:320, 5:180), and holds, at least on a fairly prevalent interpretation, that practical reason's autonomy consists in prescribing the moral law to itself, Watkins's claim about the two essential elements of Kant's concept of law in general is as plausible (and, perhaps, thereby, also unsurprising) as a claim regarding Kant on laws can get. The real difficulty lies in substantiating the core argument that this concept, with these two components, exhaustively accounts for all of Kant's consistent and significant employments of the notion of law.

Watkins examines four distinct contexts in which Kant talks about laws with a view to establishing the specific ways in which the suggested generic concept is instantiated. The first is Kant's account of the most fundamental laws of nature. Part I (chapter 2) focuses on what Kant calls "the principles of the understanding" in the Critique of Pure Reason. These are in fact the highest order possible laws of nature: since they are transcendentally justified as the a priori conditions of the possibility of experience, all empirical objects, events, or whatever particular laws there might be in nature must necessarily agree with them. Part II (chapters 3 through 6) maintains that the three Laws of Mechanics that Kant formulates in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science are also transcendentally justifiable, albeit not directly derivable from the "principles" themselves, i.e., they are conditions of the possibility of our experience of "matter" instead of empirical objects in general. The second context Watkins takes up is that of teleological principles (Part III, chapters 7 and 8). These principles offer teleological explanations of natural organisms, as opposed to the mechanical explanations grounded in laws of mechanics, and satisfy reason's demand for complete explanation by making it possible to view nature as a whole as a system of purposes.

The third context, which is taken up in Part IV (chapters 9 and 10), is Kant's treatment of two distinct sets of regulative principles in the Critique of Pure Reason. Chapter 9 discusses the fairly understudied laws of rational cosmology that Kant inserts (pretty much out of nowhere) right after the Refutation of Idealism, in the context of his elucidation of the postulate of necessity (A229/B282), as the principles of "no gap, no leap, no chance, no fate in the world" (in mundo non datur hiatus, non datur saltus, non datur casus, non datur fatum). Chapter 10 considers homogeneity, specification, and continuity of forms, which Kant identifies in the Appendix to the Dialectic as regulative principles presupposing that the order of forms or kinds in nature is responsive to the logical hierarchical order of our concepts.

Finally, Part V (chapters 11 and 12) investigates the fourth context where Kant lays out his conception of the moral law as that which, unlike laws of nature examined in the first three contexts, obligates (at least in the case of rational beings with finite wills) without determining. Watkins finds Kant's choice to construe morality in terms of a moral law to be significant in its historical context and grounds his claim that both laws of nature and the moral law instantiate one univocal concept of law on the structural parallelism between Kant's accounts of theoretical legislation (of the understanding), especially in the Prolegomena, and practical autonomy or self-legislation in the Groundwork and his more mature practical texts.

All of the chapters are extremely well written. They offer strong insights into the intricate issues surrounding Kant's various discussions of laws, and effectively assure us of the importance of the topic for Kant's broader philosophical system. However, despite the utmost clarity of the central thesis introduced in the beginning (introduction and chapter 1), the rest of the book does not deliver the kind of bidirectional cohesiveness between this thesis and the individual chapters that it seems to promise. First, it is not clear how the generic concept of a law, quite convincingly attributed to Kant, should help us better understand the individual questions raised by the chapters, or more importantly, how it supports the particular solutions Watkins offers interpretive puzzles in these chapters. For instance, one does not see why Watkins's particular reading of Kant's account of mechanical laws in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science in Part II (i.e., the particular reconstructions of their transcendental justifications and the historical claim that Kant substantially deviates from Newton's formulation of these laws) or the particular solution he offers for the antinomy of teleological judgment in chapter 7 could not work even if one rejects his particular idea of the generic concept of law in Kant. At times Watkins gives the impression that he is content with the claim that the former are compatible or "fit with" the latter (p. 145). This, however, seems a bit too modest, for one expects to be shown that this "fit" works to the exclusion of alternatives on both ends, that is, the alternative interpretations of the topics in individual chapters and alternative univocal concepts of law attributable to Kant, if any. Perhaps the issue of cohesiveness is a natural consequence of the fact that the book is composed of revised versions of sixteen papers that Watkins has previously published as standalone articles in various venues over the course of the last twenty or so years.

The more pressing issue with the substance of the book, I think, is the lack of a satisfactory discussion of the status of particular empirical laws of nature in Kant and how they would be captured by the suggested generic concept of law. Watkins brings up these laws only in the concluding chapter, and does not go beyond a rather cursory and not terribly informative reference to them (pp. 269, 273). These would be specific causal laws forming the bulk of empirical or non-pure sciences, for example, the laws of magnetism or hydrodynamics, which are less fundamental than the principles of the understanding and the mechanical laws, as they are not the conditions of the possibility of our experience, and yet not merely regulative like the teleological or rational cosmological principles or merely obligating without determining like the moral law. Since there is no question that Kant holds that there are such laws and that they are necessary (A91-2/B123-4, A159/B198, A200/B246, 4:468-9, 5:183), the primary question here would be: in what sense are these laws necessary? This is quite an interesting question in and of itself, because despite his broad inventory of the notions of necessity, Kant does not offer a clear answer to it.

Now, it is obvious that particular empirical laws of nature cannot be transcendentally necessary like the a priori principles of the understanding (and the laws of mechanics, on Watkins's account). For although the principles determine that nature be law-governed, they underdetermine which particular laws should govern nature and thereby leave the latter transcendentally contingent (A127, 5:180, 5:184). In other words, like any and all empirical content of experience, empirical laws of nature must be compatible or "stand under" (unterstehen) (B165), but are not entailed by and thus not derivable from those merely formal principles. Contrary to what Friedman (2014, 533) and Walker (1990, 252) seem to claim, it is not quite a viable option to identify the kind of necessity that empirical laws are supposed to have with the notion of necessity offered by the postulate of necessity. For even setting aside its particular interpretive complications, Kant makes it sufficiently clear that this notion of necessity, i.e., "that whose connection with the actual is determined in accordance with general conditions of experience is (exists) necessarily" (B266), applies only to the alterations in the states of empirical substances (A227-8/B280), not to what would govern or determine these alterations. Again, the necessity of these laws is not explainable in terms of what Kant sometimes calls "subjective" or "rational necessity" either. For even if we can perhaps meaningfully say that it is rationally necessary for us to seek and/or presuppose systematicity in nature (to satisfy the demands of reason or of the reflecting judgment), this still does not explain what kind of necessity we should attach to the particular laws forming that system.

Some like Guyer (1990) have suggested that particular empirical laws acquire necessity in virtue of being part of such a hierarchical system of laws. Yet, as I noted above, given that the transcendental necessity of the highest order laws of nature does not logically trickle down to lower order laws, it is not clear why being part of that hierarchy would add a necessity to the latter and what kind of necessity this would be. While Watkins does not pick a side in this book, his account of Kantian causality in his very influential Kant and the Metaphysics of Causality (2005), appears to bring him closer to the alternative and, I think, the more viable view, rearticulated and defended by, for instance, Kreines (2009) and Stang (2016), that particular empirical laws are necessary in the sense of obtaining in virtue of or as grounded in the "natures" or "real essences" of things.

However, even if this might amount to a genuine kind of necessity -- Stang calls it "nomic necessity" to distinguish it from all other notions of necessity available in Kant -- it would still not resolve the problem. For not only does Kant hold that necessity, in general, is cognized only a priori (B3-4), which entails that nothing empirical can be known to be necessary, but he also specifically states that we can never cognize the necessity of empirical laws of nature, and even that these "so-called laws" (sogenannten Gesetzen) are in fact "rules" (Regeln) that one "must" (muss) nevertheless think as necessary (5:184-5), where "must" presumably implies the kind of subjective or rational necessity rooted in our pursuit of order or systematicity in nature. Yet even if we set aside Kant's such skeptical statements and the issue of the knowability of the necessity altogether, and concede that empirical laws possess an objective kind of necessity, it remains unclear how they can still satisfy the second condition in Watkins's generic concept of law of being legislated by a spontaneous faculty of ours, i.e., the understanding or reason, if they are indeed grounded in the empirical natures of things (instead of the natures of our cognitive faculties).

While granting that there are "special issues" regarding empirical laws, Watkins still seems to hold that these laws are based on the understanding since they are "the result of the combination of the lawfulness of the a priori laws prescribed by the understanding with an empirical content that has its source in our sensibility and in the empirical objects" and "the understanding has a priority over whatever sensible content is given to it." (p. 273) However, this would not really do the trick. For the priority in question is that of the form over the content or matter and amounts to a relation of agreement or compatibility of the latter with the former and not to one of logical entailment or (complete or sufficient) determination of the latter by the former. And such "combination" of the a priori laws of the understanding with whatever is given to our sensibility is in fact the very condition of the possibility of any empirical object, and thus necessarily applies to all empirical content indiscriminately, not just empirical laws or rules. Being conditioned by the laws of the understanding would of course make whatever is conditioned lawful in a rigorous sense, but this is not the same as being legislated by the understanding. The former is just the reiteration of Kant's claim that the understanding is the lawgiver of nature, but does not warrant the further, transitive claim that whatever in nature that agrees with the laws legislated by the understanding is also a law legislated by the understanding.


Freidman, M., 2014. "Laws of Nature and Causal Necessity". Kant-Studien 105(4): 531-553.

Guyer, P. 1990. "Reason and Reflective Judgment: Kant on the Significance of Systematicity". Noûs 24(1): 17-43.

Kreines, J. 2009. "Kant on the Laws of Nature: Laws, Necessitation, and the Limitation of Our Knowledge". European Journal of Philosophy 17 (4): 527-558

Stang, N. 2016. Kant's Modal Metaphysics. Oxford University Press

Walker, R. 1990. "Kant's Conception of Empirical Law". Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 64 (1): 243-258.