Kant on Mind, Action, and Ethics

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Julian Wuerth, Kant on Mind, Action, and Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2014, 349pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780199587629.

Reviewed by Jeanine M. Grenberg, St. Olaf College


Julian Wuerth's book is an ambitious one. He promises us at least: a new account of the soul as substance (rejecting extant accounts of the soul from Patricia Kitcher, Karl Ameriks and Henry E. Allison, among others), a complete map of the powers of the mind (cognition, feeling and desire, with all their various subcategories), a theory of action which emerges from all this, and a rejection of constructivism and a defense of moral realism which emerge from that theory of action. These are claims which range broadly across topics in Kant's philosophy of mind, metaphysics, epistemology, theory of action, ethics and more. And Wuerth repeatedly promises us he will do all this with a broader and more complete exploration of Kant's oeuvre than has previously been accomplished.

This is an awful lot to promise and, at the outset, I doubted whether he could pull together in one coherent monograph everything he promises. I still find the book rather long and demanding, with occasional asides which make it at times challenging to remind oneself of the overall goal. And, yet, Wuerth does accomplish much of what he promises in a monograph with one overall aim. The thought that connects all these various topics together is articulated clearly by Wuerth:

talk about powers [of the mind], which for Kant are merely the relations between a substance and its accidents, is awkward at best if one believes, as most have, that Kant rejects any ontologically significant version of the conclusion that we are a substance. (189)

As such, to tell an adequate story of a theory of action which relies upon an account of the powers of cognition, feeling and desire, we must begin by making sense of the extent to which Kant accepts a notion of the soul as substance in an "ontologically significant sense." (189)

This is exactly what Wuerth goes on to do, first spending more than half the book on a series of chapters which assesses Kant's "substantial soul." Wuerth insists that if we read Kant's corpus overall (starting before the first Critique, then turning to the first Critique, and finally moving to post-Critique thoughts), we will find that the discussion of the Paralogisms in the Critique of Pure Reason is only his negative project of rational psychology, providing only hints of the positive account of rational psychology which Kant wants to retain after ridding it of its metaphysical excesses. According to Wuerth, in his negative account of rational psychology, Kant rejects the excessive claim that immortality of the soul can be concluded from reflection upon the soul as substance. But once that excessive claim is rejected, there is still much more to say about the substantial soul. The rationalists' failure to recognize the virtues of transcendental idealism prevented them from being able to cling to notions of "permanence, incorruptibility and personality" (116) of the soul in any but the most heavy handed of metaphysical ways. But transcendental idealism gives Kant a new way to understand the applicability of such ontologically significant notions of the soul. An extensive quote from Wuerth makes the point most succinctly:

Kant's transcendental idealism sees the objects of sensibility, including phenomenal substance, as mere appearances, distinct in kind from things in themselves. In application to these objects of appearance, the concepts of substantiality, simplicity and identify have a determinate meaning, specifying something about these objects in terms of their phenomenal properties, and here this meaning includes permanence, incorruptibility, and personality. The rationalists, however, for lack of recognition of the distinction in kind between sensibility an understanding, examine the I of pure apperception and recognize no need to be limited to indeterminate, pure categories in application to the soul but instead conflate these pure categories with their phenomenal, determinate, sensible counterparts. Kant accordingly rejects these conclusion, but he at the same time recognizes and embraces the thinner, indeterminate, and yet ontologically significant versions of these conclusions, namely, the pure categories. We are aware, through pure self-consciousness, that we are a something in general, that as such we have powers through which we can bring about accidents (mental states, in our case), but that we are distinct from all accidents and so all predicates, so that we can draw no determinate or useful conclusions about ourselves [noumenally]. (117)

Essentially, in transcendental idealism, we can, noumenally, say of ourselves that we are substances, but (because we encounter ourselves not as object but as subject and are thus distanced from our accidents as objects) draw from that fact only that we are 'something in general', not further claims related to immortality. Nonetheless, the fact that we are substances is a "meaningful" claim. (185) As Wuerth puts it later:

we are . . . an existence that does not inhere in another substance as an accident, nor do our accidents inhere in another substance; instead, our accidents inhere in us through the exercise of our own powers . . . Moreover, our substantial soul is simple in that, in itself . . . it is a single thing, a unity, without spatial or temporal complexity. (185-186)

We can, furthermore, say a good deal about the soul as substance phenomenally: the soul as phenomenal substance does indeed have permanence, incorruptibility and personality.

In many ways, Wuerth is here simply rehearsing some of Kant's basic commitments in the face of his criticism of rationalism. And yet, I think he is right that these basic understandings have not been properly incorporated into an understanding of Kant's rational psychology. His perusal of Kant's texts on this point is indeed more complete -- and at times more startling -- than those of previous interpreters. He states, for example, that many appeal to Reflexion 6001 as a singular, aberrant reference Kant makes to the soul as "noumenal substance," noting that this text "is commonly dismissed peremptorily as the exception to the rule." (131) But Wuerth goes on to provide an impressively amassed summary of numerous post-1780 texts which continue and expand upon this theme of soul as substance. I think it cannot be argued, versus Wuerth, that Kant had no positive project of rational psychology. At best, one would have to claim that a rather significant aspect of Kant's corpus is not as central to Kant's ideas as one might think. Wuerth is thus successful in defending a new, rather unexpected interpretation of Kant on rational psychology.

With this new account of soul as substance in place, Wuerth goes on to consider the "accidents" of these substances, viz., the powers that can be attributed to it. In a central, extensive and pivotal chapter, Wuerth thus considers, at some length, the powers attributable to the mind in cognition, feeling and desire, finding all three of these powers to be crucial for appreciating Kant's understanding of the human mind.

A distinctive moment in this long chapter -- and a good example of the interpretive value to be found in the "big picture" approach he has brought to Kant's texts -- is his insistence, versus Christine Korsgaard, that the distinctiveness and value of humanity is grounded not simply in our power or capacity to set ends but, more broadly, in our very capacity for self-consciousness. According to Wuerth:

Kant makes claims throughout his works that what serves as the ultimate source of value in the world is, variously, self-consciousness, rational nature, humanity, or freedom, and we here see how these claims come together in one consistent account: insofar as we have self-consciousness, we have a reflective capacity that accounts for our rational nature, humanity, and freedom, and each of these sets us apart from the rest of nature. (218)

One text upon which Wuerth relies here to make his point is a good example of the startling things we discover in his extensive review of Kant's corpus. When affirming the centrality of self-consciousness for grounding the worth of persons, Kant, in his anthropology lectures of 1781/2, notes: "'The I contains that which distinguishes humans from all animals. If a horse could grasp the thought I, I would climb down and need to view it as my equal . . . ' (Me, 25:859)". (cited, 207) Once again, the really impressive thing about Wuerth's analysis is the exceedingly careful review he provides of a broad range of Kant's texts, many hidden in obscure corners that simply have not had the opportunity to have their influence on recent interpretive discussions. Once the hard work of bringing these texts to light is accomplished, in many ways, all that Wuerth needs to do is to point at them. They speak for themselves, and Wuerth is right to point us in apparently radical directions as genuinely Kantian directions.

After all of this set up about the soul as substance and its powers, it does not surprise us when Wuerth brings this complex discussion of cognition, feeling and desire to bear upon questions in theory of action and ethics. As he reminds us, "the commentary on Kant's ethics often builds on a shaky understanding of this account of the mind's powers," leading to "the common perception of Kant's moral agent . . . as overly rational." (198) Though I might remind Wuerth that recent commentators in Kant's ethics have done much to overturn this caricature of Kant's ethics, he is right that some recent interpreters, and especially the influential "intellectualist" interpreters of Kant's ethics spearheaded by Christine Korsgaard, continue to emphasize the role of cognition over feeling and desire. Indeed, his Chapter 8 analysis of Korsgaard as an intellectualist, though it covers territory already considered by many in the literature (including myself), is a particularly impressive rejection of Korsgaard's theory of action as distinctively non-Kantian. And, once again, he is so successful here because of his unrelenting commitment to reading texts carefully and thoroughly (here, with the "texts" in question being those of both Kant and Korsgaard). Indeed, he rather sternly accuses Korsgaard of over-narrowness in her interpretation of Kant's texts, much as he had accused interpreters of Kant's rational psychology:

We noted Sidgwick's emphasis on the Groundwork despite the Groundwork's vague language around the question of the will, and it turns out that Korsgaard's account likewise dwells mainly on the Groundwork's theories of self and action. What's more, Korsgaard, like Sidgwick, stays away from Kant's theoretical philosophy and never works with Kant's untranslated philosophy, his personal notes, the notes from his lectures on anthropology, empirical psychology, or metaphysics from any period, all of which are valuable on the issue of the self and choice, in addition to not considering Kant's account of Willkűr or its relation to Wille, even as presented in the Metaphysics of Morals. (259-260)

One might find this slap on the wrist a bit school-marmish. And yet Wuerth's philosophical point is clear. Indeed, the whole point of writing a book so long and apparently meandering is made clear: if one tries to provide a Kantian theory of action without carefully considering the broad range of Kant's texts in ethics, metaphysics, anthropology and more, then one will not be successful in providing a genuinely Kantian theory of action.

One of the most satisfying sections in Wuerth's extensive analysis of Korsgaard is the point at which he considers, in turn, her accounts of the use of the terms "incentive", inclination" and the "self," showing each of her usages to fly in the face of how Kant would understand these terms. Further, all of these misreadings share a common theme: they all "desensualize or intellectualize" (262) these ideas in Kant, making them unfit for a Kantian world view within which both sensibility and reason have a role to play. As he notes, in response to Korsgaard's suggestion that an inclination is a "proposal" to one's reflective, deliberative self:

But . . . an inclination is no mere proposal. The concept of a proposal, unlike that of an inclination as a type of desire or incentive, does not imply an urge to act on the proposal; just consider the proposal to go pound sand. Thus the quality of urging, inclining, and desiring is simply absent from Korsgaard's account of sensible desires. (263)

We see here the payoff for the long route Wuerth has taken to providing an account of Kant's theory of action. Having investigated self as substance and then the powers of that substance in great detail, it is hard to disagree with Wuerth when he suggests Korsgaard's account of inclination is simply not Kant's. He has done the hard work to show us that he knows very well indeed what Kant is saying on these issues. So, one might still prefer Korsgaard's account overall, but one also has to admit that it simply is not Kantian.

I recommend this book highly, though with a couple cautions. First, it is indeed a very long book. Further, it is a long book largely because it is so unwaveringly committed to a careful and complete analysis of Kant's texts. It is thus not to be recommended to those not prepared for or interested in such extensive textual analysis. But for those of us hungry to expand our appreciation of Kant's corpus overall, this book is a gold-mine of little noted yet deeply significant texts. The work Wuerth has done to comb carefully through long texts and really get to the heart of what is important philosophically about them reveals itself in these many pages. Along the way, he challenges us to accept the apparently (but not actually) un-Kantian ideas that the self is a substance and that the sensible and the intellectual have something approaching equal standing in Kant's theory of action. So, to reiterate: I recommend this book highly.