Kant on Moral Autonomy

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Oliver Sensen (ed.), Kant on Moral Autonomy, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 311pp., $95.00 (hbk.), ISBN 9781107004863.

Reviewed by Jeppe von Platz, Suffolk University


This book gives us fourteen essays on Kant's conception of autonomy, an introduction by Oliver Sensen, and a postscript by Onora O'Neill. The essays are presented in honor of O'Neill's work as a scholar and teacher. It is a fine volume.

A volume such as this can be assessed in at least four ways. First, we might ask whether the topic merits such a collection. It does. Autonomy is a central term of Kant's practical philosophy and the concept of autonomy has found an influential place in contemporary moral and political philosophy. Thus, to understand both Kant's ethics and its lasting significance we will do well to understand his conception of autonomy and how it relates to contemporary conceptions of autonomy and their employment. This volume promises to help us in these understandings.

Second, we might assess the whole in light of the quality of the parts. If each essay is relevant and good, then we could say that the volume succeeds -- and indeed by this standard it succeeds very well. Sensen has gathered a very impressive group of contributors and each contribution is of high quality.

Third, we might measure the collection against the higher and more holistic standard of how well the collection realizes the stated intentions of the editor. Sensen writes that he intends it to illuminate three questions about Kantian autonomy, so we can measure the volume by how well it deals with these questions.

Fourth, we might aim even higher and measure it against an ideal of what a book of this sort would achieve. Let us say that the best volume on Kant on moral autonomy would cover the history of autonomy before Kant, track the influences of this history on Kant, outline the development of the concept through Kant's career, articulate the attractions and problems of Kant's mature conception of autonomy, connect Kant's conception of autonomy to other issues in Kant's philosophy, track the reception and impact of Kant's conception of autonomy, show how Kant's conception of autonomy differs from contemporary conceptions, and assess the relevance of Kantian autonomy for contemporary philosophy (and beyond).

As already noted, I think that the book succeeds by the first two measures, so in the following I look at how it fares by the latter two.

The three questions that Sensen intends this volume to treat are: What is Kant's conception of autonomy? What is the history and influence of Kant's conception of autonomy? And, what is the significance of Kantian autonomy for contemporary moral philosophy? The volume has three parts corresponding to these three questions.

In Part I Thomas E. Hill Jr., Andrews Reath, Karl Ameriks, and Paul Guyer offer interpretations of Kant's conception of autonomy. Hill contrasts Kant's conception of autonomy with contemporary conceptions and argues that Kant's conception offers a solid basis for contemporary conceptions. Reath presents his reading of autonomy as sovereignty, discusses how it fits and explains Kant's theory of the will, and argues that his interpretation explains the authority of the categorical imperative. Ameriks defends Kant's ethics from charges that it involves radical existentialism and panicky metaphysics and argues that we can understand Sartre's existentialism as centrally concerned with Kantian autonomy. Guyer argues that Kantian autonomy is a sort of moral self-mastery that is acquired only progressively and gradually through the cultivation and strengthening of the aesthetic preconditions of autonomy -- moral feeling, conscience, love of others, and self-esteem.

Of course, every essay in the collection  discusses Kant's conception of autonomy, so the extent to which the volume provides the materials for understanding Kant's conception of autonomy depends on the collection as a whole. Taking the collection as a whole, I think that Sensen achieves this first aim. The collection offers a comprehensive view of what is agreed upon and what is controversial about Kant's conception of autonomy in contemporary Kant scholarship.

In Part II Richard Velkley, Susan M. Shell, Henry E. Allison, Jerome B. Schneewind, and Katrin Flikschuh discuss the second topic -- the history and influence of Kant's conception of autonomy. This topic has parts: the sources of Kant's conception of autonomy, the development of Kant's views on the nature and significance of autonomy, and the influence of Kant's conception of autonomy on later philosophy. Velkley argues that Kant's encounter with Rousseau led to a reorientation of his philosophical ambitions and that Kant's conception of autonomy, and indeed the entire critical philosophy, is meant as a "genuine science of reason" (100) that can help us overcome our self-made maladies and advance us towards true (moral) enlightenment. Shell suggests that we can understand the nature of the paradox that Kant articulates in the Groundwork (GMS 4:439), as well as Kant's solution to this paradox, if we look at the development of Kant's understanding of the relation between substances and community from his earliest writings through the dissertation and the First Critique and into the Groundwork.

Allison traces the reception of Kant's conception of autonomy in Fichte, Schiller, and Hegel. He argues that, though Schiller and Hegel rejected the dualisms rational/sensible, principled/inclined, autonomous/heteronymous that they found in Kant's philosophy, their conceptions of autonomy retain the crucial Kantian emphasis on moral laws as the form of autonomous willing and are, in that respect, closer to Kant's than to contemporary conceptions of autonomy. Schneewind traces the history of Kantian autonomy in Anglophone moral philosophy after Kant and shows that until recently interest in Kantian autonomy was quite limited -- indeed, in the century that passed between Mill's On Liberty and Rawls's A Theory of Justice, "the topic of autonomy simply did not matter in Anglophone moral philosophy." (154) Flikschuh, finally, argues that the moral value of autonomy is limited and that Kantian autonomy provides slim support for defenses of collective self-legislation and is of little use for contemporary liberalism.

Taken together the essays in Part II provide illuminating discussions of the place of autonomy in Kant's philosophy, why he came to assign it this place, as well as indications of the impact of Kantian autonomy in German idealism and Anglophone moral philosophy. There are also indications of the contrast between Kantian and contemporary conceptions of autonomy, but these are not pursued, nor do we find much discussion of the relative merits of Kantian and contemporary conceptions of autonomy.

Part III promises to pursue this contrast and provide this discussion, insofar as the essays by Heiner F. Klemme, Jens Timmermann, Dieter Schönecker, Philip Stratton-Lake, and Sensen)are meant to illuminate the relevance of Kantian autonomy for contemporary moral philosophy. Klemme argues that the Critique of Teleological Judgment of the Third Critique provides resources for understanding the content, function, and relations between the concepts of nature, purposiveness, reason, and autonomy as they appear in the Groundwork. Timmermann focuses on the formula of humanity. He argues that humanity is "the incorruptible moral capacity that makes us the kind of beings we are" (217), that autonomy is the basis of dignity, and that the aim and point of GMS II is to present the formulas of humanity, autonomy, and the realm of ends as sources of moral motivation (and not as adding anything to GMS I's analysis of moral cognition).

Schönecker offers a commentary on the first subsection of section III of the Groundwork. He argues that Kant's claim that "the free will and a will under moral laws are the same" (GMS, 4:447) should be understood as the analytical proposition that "the free will of a holy being and the free will of a human being considered as a member of the intelligible world is a will under the non-imperatival moral law." (239) Stratton-Lake argues that "the Kantian attempt to establish an essential link between morality and autonomy fails" (261), and that we should welcome this conclusion, since it is confused to think that autonomy has non-derivative value, and since the Kantian theory of autonomy mistakenly places the authority of moral laws in the will of the agent, rather than in real properties. Sensen, finally, explains Kant's claim that autonomy is the supreme principle of morality and shows why Kantian ethics maintains that desire-based theories, divine command theories, and moral realism offer mistaken views of the nature of morality and the sources of moral obligation.

Sensen's stated aim for Part III is to discuss the relevance of Kantian autonomy for contemporary moral philosophy -- presumably with the further intent to show that it is in fact relevant. I am not sure that he achieves this. To begin with, I found it hard to see how the essays by Klemme, Timmermann, and Schönecker serve this aim. Each of their essays focuses quite narrowly on questions about how we should interpret the Groundwork, so it is unclear how they support the contemporary relevance of Kantian autonomy. Of course, these essays explain why autonomy is a central term of, respectively, Kant's philosophies of nature, value, and freedom, so they indicate that autonomy is relevant for contemporary moral philosophy, insofar as Kant's philosophies of nature, value, and freedom are relevant. Yet, they give us no reason to think that Kant's philosophies of nature, value, and freedom are of contemporary relevance, and so do not establish the relevance of autonomy either. Moreover, Stratton-Lake argues that Kantian autonomy is irrelevant for contemporary moral philosophy. So the only essay in Part III that defends the relevance of Kantian autonomy is Sensen's own. But in the first paragraph of his essay, Sensen rephrases the question "What is the moral significance of Kant's conception of autonomy?" as the question "What exactly does Kant think is important about autonomy, and what is his argument?" (262) -- and Sensen explicitly aims only to explain and not to defend Kant's argument (262). So, a bit disappointingly, Part III offers little argument for the relevance of Kantian autonomy for contemporary moral philosophy.

Of course, the relevance of Kantian autonomy is touched upon by several of the other essays -- including those by Hill, Allison, Reath, Flikschuh, and Ameriks -- but it would have been nice to see one or two dedicated to defending the continued importance of Kantian autonomy. As it stands, the only two essays dedicated to the topic of relevance are those of Flikschuh and Stratton-Lake, and they both argue that Kantian autonomy is irrelevant.

Is Kantian autonomy relevant for contemporary moral philosophy? To answer this question, we need to distinguish between two kinds of relevance: usefulness and requiredness. That is, Kantian autonomy is weakly relevant if it offers a way to satisfy some need of contemporary moral philosophy, but it is strongly relevant if contemporary moral philosophy must find a place for Kantian autonomy. I think that Sensen would like the essays to provide an argument for the stronger kind of relevance, but they only support the weaker kind.

As brought out by the essays, Kantian autonomy is complex: it is an account of reason (Reath, Klemme, Schönecker); it is positive freedom (Hill, Ameriks, Guyer, Velkley, Allison, Klemme, Sensen); it is a capacity for self-determination through the will's self-legislation of the moral law (Hill, Ameriks, Guyer, Allison, Schneewind, Flikschuh, Timmermann, Sensen); it is an ideal of moral self-determination in accord with the moral law (Guyer, Sensen); it is the basis of dignity (Reath, Velkley, Shell, Schneewind, Klemme, Timmermann); it is a theory about the nature and authority of moral obligation (Hill, Reath, Sensen); and it is a theory of morality that implies the falsity of moral theories that make morality and its authority conditional on factors external to the will of the obligated person (Ameriks, Allison, Stratton-Lake, Sensen). In contemporary conceptions, by contrast, autonomy is conceived of as the capacity for rational choice that defines the competency of persons, a capacity that is also the source of dignity and the rights of self-determination that said dignity confers on persons. So, Kantian and contemporary conceptions of autonomy differ. Contemporary conceptions are simpler and much less involved with claims about human freedom, the nature and authority of morality, or the structure of rationality than Kantian autonomy.

But they are (or can be) related. Kantian autonomy implies the contemporary view of competency, a theory of the dignity of persons, and that competent persons ought to be free from coercion or manipulation. Kantian autonomy thus offers a framework for contemporary autonomy (as emphasized in the essays of Hill, Ameriks, Allison, and Sensen). In that sense, at least, Kantian autonomy is relevant for contemporary conceptions of autonomy. This much the book does show.

Yet, it offers little support for two further claims we need in order to show that contemporary moral philosophy must find a place for Kantian autonomy. The first of these claims is that autonomy is a central term of morality. The volume nicely explains why Kant thinks that autonomy is the central term, but offers no defense of Kant's arguments that could persuade those who do not already accept the conclusion. The second of these claims is that we need the Kantian framework to make sense of contemporary conceptions of autonomy. Alas, while Kantian autonomy implies contemporary conceptions of autonomy, contemporary conceptions of autonomy do not imply Kantian autonomy, and the essays offer no arguments to believe that they do. So the book does not establish that Kantian autonomy is relevant for contemporary moral philosophy in the stronger sense.

In sum, the volume almost satisfies the editor's stated intentions. The only way it falls short is that it offers little argument for the relevance of Kantian autonomy for contemporary moral philosophy.

This leaves us with the fourth and last measure of assessment: whether the book provides everything one could hope for. I think that it gets very close. I would have liked an essay on the history of autonomy before Kant. Several essays discuss Rousseau's influence on Kant, but it would have been nice to see a treatment also of anticipations of autonomy in Stoic, Christian, natural law, and other traditions that informed Rousseau and Kant.

In sum, this collection gives us fourteen good essays on an interesting and important topic. As a whole, the volume provides a thorough treatment of Kant's conception of autonomy, the influence of Rousseau, and how Kant's conception of autonomy developed over time, as well as indications of how Kant's conception of autonomy differs from, and could support, contemporary conceptions of autonomy. While I would have liked a more direct defense of the continued relevance of Kantian autonomy and a more thorough treatment of the historical sources of Kant's conception of autonomy other than Rousseau, the volume covers almost everything one could hope for. So, the volume succeeds by every measure of success, and I wholeheartedly recommend it to anyone interested in Kant, autonomy, or the continued relevance of Kantian autonomy.