Kant on Practical Justification: Interpretive Essays

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Mark Timmons and Sorin Baiasu (eds.), Kant on Practical Justification: Interpretive Essays, Oxford University Press, 2013, 324pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195395686.

Reviewed by Patrick Kain, Purdue University


Kant's practical philosophy, which includes at least his moral philosophy, philosophy of right, philosophy of religion, and philosophy of history, contains a wide variety of claims that Kant attempts to justify. There are, for example, Kant's justifications of the "Formula of Universal Law," of an obligation to keep one's promises, of prudential reasons or imperatives, of the claim that humans are free, of belief in God, and so on. Kant offers different justifications, even somewhat different kinds of justifications, for such claims in his practical philosophy, and the nature of his approach to "practical justification" remains a matter of great controversy. This collection of excellent essays advances recent debates about this important issue in Kant and, to some extent, in recent Kantian philosophy as well. While five of these papers trace back to a 2007 conference in Manchester, they contain timely revisions and are accompanied by nine other, timely papers. Most of the papers appear here for the first time, although a few (those by Karl Ameriks and Henry Allison) also appeared roughly concurrently elsewhere, and one (Robert Stern's) distills major themes of a recent book.

This collection aims "to provide a comprehensive and structured examination of" the topic of "practical justification in Kantian philosophy." (1-2) Sorin Baiasu's helpful introduction classifies fourteen different types of claim that are candidates for practical justification, a classification he maps onto the fourteen chapters. Each of these types receives some discussion, though the subject of practical justification in Kant is larger than one collection of independent articles could exhaustively cover. There is no extensive discussion of the nature of practical justification, as opposed to theoretical justification, for example, and none of the chapters focuses on the justification of particular obligations via Kant's "Formula of Universal Law" (which has received sustained attention elsewhere). Better than comprehensiveness, the volume offers a collection of high-quality investigations by leading scholars, investigations which often overlap in fruitful ways and contribute to a number of important debates. In what follows, I will describe each of the chapters and indicate how some of them interact and advance the field on a few important topics. I will treat the chapters under three topical headings, beginning with those devoted to justifications of the categorical imperative, proceeding to those devoted to the justification of some derivative moral and political norms, and concluding with those devoted to the justification of claims about God and freedom.

Allen Wood's "Kant on Practical Reason" surveys Kant's theory of practical reason, with particular attention to questions about the nature of and relations between instrumental reason, prudential reason, and specifically moral reason. Wood contends, plausibly, that prudential reasons depend upon formulating a determinate idea of happiness and on giving that idea priority amongst one's non-moral ends. Wood suggests, contra Christine Korsgaard, that prudential reasoning is supposed to be subordinate to, yet not get its justification from, moral reasoning. Finally, Wood claims, Kantian moral reasoning and moral justification require the recognition of others and "embracing," "including," or "integrating" their point of view in practical reasoning.

While Wood argues for the justificatory independence of prudential and moral justification, Larry Krasnoff ("Constructing Practical Justification: How Can the Categorical Imperative Justify Desire-Based Action?") develops a rival approach. Krasnoff argues that we are motivated to "adopt" the categorical imperative and a requirement of shared norms because of the "irreducible plurality" of conceptions of happiness and the threat that someone else's conception of happiness will be imposed upon us. On his approach, practical justification is constructed, rather than discovered, and both moral and prudential justification depend upon the categorical imperative which provides "a practical surrogate for a fully justifying principle of practical reason." (98)

Robert Stern suggests that Kant combines a "realist" account of good action with an "anti-realist" account of moral obligation. In "Kant, Moral Obligation, and the Holy Will," Stern calls attention to Kant's oft-ignored conception of a "holy will" (from the Groundwork): a holy will necessarily acts on representations of what is good, but has no obligations. This suggests that the basic justification of good action, common to holy and unholy wills, is a realist justification, grounded in "the value of free, rational agency." At the same time, "obligation" in particular and its particular normative and motivational profile -- the elements of constraint, necessitation, resistance, and struggle -- are said to depend upon the distinctive subjective imperfections of unholy wills, which suggests that obligation is mind-dependent in a way goodness is not. Stern contends that this combination of realism and antirealism, and also of motivational externalism and internalism, sheds light upon an important disagreement between Kant and Schiller and Hegel.

In "Constructivism and Self-constitution," Paul Guyer compares Kant's attempts to justify the moral law with recent Kant-inspired accounts of justification found in the work of Rawls and Korsgaard. Guyer argues that Kant's attempted justification of morality in Groundwork III conflicts with the possibility of selfish, immoral agency and depends upon claims about the noumenal self that conflict with Kant's general epistemology, as expressed in the Critique of Pure Reason. Guyer contends that Korsgaard's approach, which maintains that all action is "self-constitution" and requires intersubjectively valid reasons, also conflicts with our ordinary conception of agency. Kant's reliance, in the second Critique, upon the "fact of reason," is more modest and is analogous to Rawls's political constructivism: normative consequences are derived from an attractive, but non-provable, moral conception. Similarly, Guyer concludes, Korsgaard's ideal of self-constitution is best taken as an attractive ideal of agency, but not provably unique conception of agency.

In "Is Practical Justification in Kant Ultimately Dogmatic?," Ameriks revisits his own influential interpretation of Kant's "fact of reason," engaging two important alternatives recently advanced by Pauline Kleingeld and David Sussman. Ameriks contends that Kant does not offer -- nor do Sussman or Kleingeld successfully offer -- an entirely "independent" argument for the overridingness of morality. They offer rich, insightful descriptions of the moral perspective and of what it is to treat that perspective as overriding, accounts that appear to presuppose that one already accepts the overriding authority of morality. So "even contemporary Kantians should rest content with understanding Kant's Faktum in a regressive way, that is, as a kind of admittedly dogmatic claim made from a point already fully within a very substantive moral position." (173)

In "Formal Approaches to Kant's Formula of Humanity," Andrews Reath explores Kant's Formula of Humanity -- to treat others as ends-in-themselves -- from the perspective of "constitutivist" or "formal" accounts of justification. On this approach, a formal principle is an "internal constitutive principle of a domain of cognition or rational activity," and its status as "constitutive" is what justifies its "normative authority and foundational role." (204-205) Reath identifies several helpful desiderata for the interpretation of the Formula of Humanity and then evaluates two different formal or constitutive interpretations. On Reath's preferred "formal-formal approach" (227), which builds on recent work by Stephen Engstrom, "that rational nature is an end in itself means that the formal end of practical reason is its own proper exercise, as defined by [the Formula of Universal Law]." (221) This approach secures the equivalence between the formula of humanity and the formula of universal law and meets several other interpretive desiderata, although it admittedly leaves some distance between the formula of humanity and the rich, "substantive value of persons" familiar to ordinary moral thought. (226)

A second group of chapters focuses on the justification of first-order moral and political norms.

In "Kant's Grounding Project in The Doctrine of Virtue," Houston Smit and Mark Timmons offer a powerful commentary on and reconstruction of the "Doctrine of Virtue" from Kant's Metaphysics of Morals. They argue that Kant attempts to justify a variety of first-order duties by deriving them from a "substantive" version of the formula of humanity in conjunction with some empirical anthropological assumptions. "The mid-level moral duties Kant catalogues in [the Doctrine of Virtue] are not themselves supposed to be the products of intuitive judgment," (232) rather the formula of humanity "features concepts whose application conditions are fairly determinate," (233) and thus, in conjunction with relevant empirical facts, the formula supports derivations of many duties. Without endorsing all of Kant's own conclusion, Smit and Timmons make a good case for understanding Kant's arguments in this way, and for appreciating this form of practical justification.

Otfried Höffe argues that while Kant justifies the ground of obligation "transcendentally" without appeal to empirical elements, Kant should have been clearer than he was about how justification in his ethics and in his philosophy of right also require appeal to three levels of anthropology. First, obligation in general supposes we are finite beings that can be seduced by our desires and inclinations. Second, the general categorical imperative of right is only applicable because there is a plurality of such finite beings, coexisting and interacting in one world. The third level of anthropology concerns human corporeality and vulnerability -- our need for space and goods and care in infancy, within a finite world. Höffe contends that Kant's justification of a system of rights, and of core features of public and private right in particular, depends upon a combination of transcendental and anthropological elements.

In "Kant and Libertarianism," Howard Williams revisits his interpretation of Kant's political philosophy, arguing that Kant is not a libertarian. While some libertarians have been attracted to Kant's discussions of autonomy and innate freedom, Kant's justifications of property rights and of governmental authority also contain significant elements of "mutualism" or "socialism". Williams stresses that the Kantian state is responsible for assisting those who cannot help themselves, and for guiding the national economy, and that Kant's reasoning takes into account "the institutions of a specific society." (278) "For Kant property rights emanate from the state outwards (albeit in the form of the united general will)." (282) In the end, Kant is as much a republican as a libertarian and he "seek[s] out those forms of state authority which enable us to arise from our self-incurred immaturity properly to think and act for ourselves." (281)

Finally, several of the chapters consider questions about the justification of claims about human freedom and belief in the existence of God. In "Kant's Rechtfertigung and the Epistemic Character of Practical Justification," Sorin Baiasu argues, engaging important recent work by Andrew Chignell, that Kant's justification of the "practical postulates" (God, freedom, and immortality) has a genuine epistemic character because it purports to provide limited, but reliable information about its objects. In "Why Ought Implies Can," Sebastian Rödl suggests that Kant's practical justification of freedom is an unpacking of what is built into the practical thought that "I must do that." "Ought implies can" because thinking "I must do this" implies that I can do it, though I might not.

In "Kant's Practical Justification of Freedom," Allison defends his influential position, that, for Kant, there is "no fact of the matter about freedom," only warranted assertability from a practical perspective. (284) Allison highlights Kant's contentions (in Groundwork III) that we must act "under the idea of freedom," which is supposed to support a deduction of the categorical imperative, and then notes several problems that arise for this strategy. In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant changes course: the "fact of reason" is a defensible piece of moral phenomenology, "the consciousness of an authoritative demand that stems from one's own will rather than from an external source." (293) This demand requires that we have "a capacity to do what reason requires precisely because it requires it." (293) Allison maintains that this amounts to "a standpoint that we are compelled (by reason) to adopt in virtue of our consciousness of ourselves as bound by the moral law," (295) but, in response to Ameriks, Allison insists that this standpoint is free of ontological or metaphysical import.

In "The Place of Kant's Theism in His Moral Philosophy," John Hare argues that Kant's complex account of human agency, elaborated in his Religion, supports the important role of his theism in his moral philosophy. Hare insists that, according to Kant, humans are free beings, but also both "creatures of need," who have their own happiness as an end in addition to morality, and creatures with a "propensity to evil," who are depraved beings who "rank" our happiness ahead of our duty. Our neediness "inevitably leads to religion," because belief in God is what enables us to believe that morality and our happiness can be realized together. Our depravity implies some additional religious claims: "believing in God makes it possible for us to believe in the possibility of the revolution of the will," overcoming our depravity via some form of cooperation with God. (304) In "Freedom, Temporality, and Belief: A Reply to Hare," A. W. Moore briefly highlights the fundamental justificatory question about Kant's philosophy of religion: whether the arguments that "we must believe in God" imply a "subversive" explanation rather than a "vindicatory" explanation of that belief. (317-318)

In sum, the chapters engage in and advance recent debates about the various forms and instances of "practical justification" in Kant's philosophy, and in recent Kantian ethics. Several rival interpretations of central aspects of Kant's practical philosophy are well-represented. Scholars working on any of these topics will benefit from careful attention to many of these papers.