Kant on Reflection and Virtue

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Melissa Merritt, Kant on Reflection and Virtue, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 219pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108424714.

Reviewed by Kristi Sweet, Texas A&M University


In her book, Melissa Merritt offers the reader a comprehensive, convincing, and long overdue account of reflection and the virtues pertaining to cognition in Kant's philosophy. Merritt's portrait of the work of reflection, particularly in its role in accomplishing healthy human understanding, is a welcome addition to  the literature on Kant's epistemology. The picture that emerges from her account is of an integral, responsible, and responsive human knower. It is a deeply humanistic account of Kant's epistemology, one that unfortunately gets lost in much of the academic literature of the day, which is focused on narrow debates and abstract scenarios that have little to no bearing on Kant or on actual human concerns. At the same time, her book remains true to Kant and to his texts. Her book will be of real value to scholars working on Kant's epistemology as well as his ethics, in addition to scholars interested more broadly in the ethical dimensions of knowing and the cognitive dimensions of ethical life.

Merritt contributes to our understanding of Kant in several significant ways. First, she ultimately makes the case for a Kantian account of taking responsibility for one's cognitive practices, or what she calls cognitive virtue. Here, she demonstrates how active -- even vigilant -- one must be in order to exercise the virtues proper to knowing. We have a responsibility to come into epistemic accord with how things are. How we might accomplish this is a highlight of the book. Second, she achieves no small feat in painting a picture of what the unity of reason might look like in concreto. This issue is one of the most interesting, but also most opaque, in Kant, and her descriptions of how cognition and virtue come into various kinds of relations are compelling both from a Kantian perspective, as well as one's own experience. The reader comes to see how crucial it is for Kant that, practically speaking, we are theoretically apt. It is of key importance for us to cognize how things actually are in order to act properly. Cognizing how things are is precisely what requires facility with reflection. Reflection, then, emerges as the faculty and activity that stands at the intersection of reason in its practical and theoretical uses. The development of how the unity of reason might be thought in Kant is part of her defense of her thesis -- which she calls the specification thesis -- that moral virtue is a specification of general cognitive virtue.

Third, and most significantly, in my view, is the possibility her account offers for developing a conception of Kantian moral judgment. We are all familiar with Kant's emphasis on duty in his descriptions of moral life. We also are familiar with his assertion that our duty, properly speaking, is to the moral law. From the outset of the reception of his moral philosophy, there was deep dissatisfaction that he does not offer any indication of how we might come to discern what we must do, however. Hegel famously charges Kant's moral philosophy with an empty formalism. Indeed, even the most sympathetic reader of Kant's practical philosophy can be left with the impression that there is little concern in Kant with how things actually go when human beings take moral action. Even more remarkable is the fact that Kant wrote the Metaphysics of Morals after the Critique of Judgment. After he develops a fully formed theory of judgment, he still does not include it as part of his account of moral life. Merritt's description of reflection and virtue, however, is a satisfying Kantian complement to his own emphasis on duty. It is perhaps the strongest aspect of this text.

Merritt's book takes its point of departure from Kant's claim that 'all judgments require reflection.' In fact, the book is an extended exegesis of this claim; it encompasses not only what Kant could possibly mean by this given his own arguments and commitments, but also what may be inferred from it more broadly with respect to his moral philosophy. The former is laid out in Part I of the text ('Reflection') encompassing Chapters 1-3, and the latter in Part II ('Virtue'), encompassing Chapters 4-7. The book draws most heavily from Kant's Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View and the Jäsche Logic. Much work has been done in recent years on Kant's Anthropology; this is part of an overdue expansion in the literature of what gets brought into the scope of our understanding of Kant's thought. However, much of the recent work on the Anthropology takes it to be at odds with the rest of the critical project -- for better or for worse. Merritt, by contrast, finds in the Anthropology provocations to be thought through more fully in the critical project -- it is a resource for thinking more intently about what may be previously unseen or underdeveloped in the critical philosophy, as well as a source that may sometimes give a fuller picture of what is discussed elsewhere. This is, I think, a very satisfying and productive hermeneutic; it presents a largely integral and coherent Kant.

In her efforts to unpack the claim that all judgments require reflection, Merritt first attempts to answer the question: What is reflection for Kant? She couches reflection, first, as a counterweight to prejudice. Prejudice, here, is not evaluative. It means simply having judged something ahead of time. Prejudices are ways of thinking we inherit from out of our cultural milieu or our past experience, from our self-interest, affects, and passions. The proper aim of responsible judging is to transcend our narrow modes of thinking and attain more adequate view of how things are. Couching responsible judgment vis à vis prejudice has, I think, two key advantages. It reminds us, first, of the enlightenment project of which Kant was a part; Merritt thus situates Kant's epistemology more broadly with respect to his larger philosophical sensibilities. It also, second, brings Kant's notions of reflection, self-reflection, and knowing how things are into clear dialogue with those twentieth century hermeneutic thinkers for whom prejudice is an ontological condition of the human being (I am thinking here principally of Heidegger and Gadamer). In any case, on Merritt's account, accomplishing responsible cognition requires two aspects of reflection. First, we need to develop something like self-knowledge, coming to understand our own perspectival view of things, or, really, coming to understand at least that our own views are initially prejudicial. Second, we need to consider "whether things really are as I take them to be" (49). The measures for this, she notes, can be found in the three maxims of healthy human understanding that Kant lays out in the third Critique. In this, we are ultimately granted security in our judgments if we can have some sense that the way in which we are judging is proper. The measure of good judgment will be to "take the appropriate interest in one's own cognitive agency" (72).

What emerges in Chapters 1-3 is an utterly convincing account of what it looks like, by Kant's lights, to take responsibility for one's own judgments. In this, Merritt's argument for how we come to cultivate healthy human understanding accords with Kant's own notions of the primacy of practical reason. That is, we are responsible all the way down, even for our cognition; we must take in an interest in making good judgments. It is also the case that her picture of healthy human understanding is that it is characterized by activity, and, with this, is something we accomplish. Our average, everyday experience does not rise to the level of responsible cognitive agency. It is something we must pay active attention to and be deliberate about -- specifically, we must be deliberate about whether or not our cognitive activity is being carried out properly.

The second half of the book, Chapters 4-7, focuses more expressly on how moral virtue may be understood as a species of cognitive virtue. I have, so far, emphasized what I think are genuinely excellent contributions to our understanding of Kant: the possible role of cognition in moral life, and the fact that we must take responsibility for our modes of knowing. The second half of the book is laudably ambitious; it forwards a strong, determinate thesis on how we are to understand some of the thorniest issues we find in the history of philosophy. The relation between theory and practice is one such issue, and Merritt's bold foray into taking up the problem with such care and attention will certainly set the terms of the debate as it takes shape in Kant scholarship for some time.

To this reader, however, the account was not quite satisfying. Merritt argues that "moral virtue is general cognitive virtue inflected for the specifically practical use of cognitive capacities" (113). That is, it is not enough on her account that our cognition be cultivated so that we may make good judgments about the situations in which we find ourselves and about what we must do. While she repeats the idea that both theoretical and practical uses of reason are species of cognition, one cannot help but find that the theoretical seems still to supersede or comes to define the practical. Instead, this cognitive endeavor seems to be the long and short of moral life. She writes, "Kantian virtue can ultimately be understood as a readiness to see facts about one's situation as themselves requiring certain responses of attention and action" (126). Seeing, however, is still a theoretical act. To name virtue -- a disposition of the will -- as a readiness to see does not quite seem to capture Kant's emphasis on the will and what it is for. Her ideas on this come to the fore most decisively in Chapter 6, where she argues that virtue is a skill. She even goes so far as identify strength with skill, and explicitly rejects that virtue be understood as "getting oneself to act from the genuinely moral motive" (180). This highlights what, for this reader, was a strong rejection of the Kantian commitment to practical reason as the will, as well as an elision of Kant's naming of reason as the faculty of desire. Indeed, the will is at the very least quite downplayed, and seems all but to fall away on the account of moral life that Merritt develops.

One last note about the argument as it stands. The first part of the book develops an excellent account of what Kant calls healthy human understanding, and does so by way of an extended engagement with reflection. However, the Critique of Judgment, which is principally about the activity of reflection, hardly makes an appearance. Given that the third Critique is about reflective judgments, one wonders why exactly it is not relied on more. This is especially true when one considers that Kant took judgments of reflection to complete his philosophical system -- that is, to bring together reason in its theoretical and practical applications. A similar question might be put to the text as a whole. While it is laudable and productive to bring works like the Jäsche Logic and the Anthropology to greater investigation in Kant scholarship, a stronger argument would need to be made for putting them at the center of our understanding of Kant. Merritt does draw in supporting remarks from those texts considered to comprise the critical core of Kant's philosophy. Her argument would have benefitted, however, from an account of how the long tradition of interpreting Kant as placing the will, moral motivation, and practical reason understood as such at the center erred in reading Kant.

These final questions are not criticisms so much as calls for further accounting. The book is well conceived and, as indicated, it will be a welcome entry to Kant scholarship for a number of reasons, not least of all its deeply humanistic sensibilities of what it is like to be a moral being and how Kant speaks to this. But, I would have been keen to learn more about what might be meant by 'cognitive' such that both theoretical and practical reason may be seen as species of it, and, too, how all of Kant's emphasis on the will and moral motivation might be integrated into her account. However, even if one does not ultimately come to agree with Merritt's argument in the second half of the book, two things remain. First, those who take Kant to have a strong commitment to the primacy of practical reason and to locate moral motivation in a more classically Kantian conception of duty will undoubtedly be pleased by the first half of the book, which, on its own, may be seen as a necessary supplement to Kant's emphasis on the will. Second, Merritt's attempt to think through Kant's claims about the unity of reason is carried out in an exceptionally sustained and thoughtful manner; to read her argument of how we might conceive it is incredibly beneficial and will no doubt move the scholarly ball down the field.