Kant on Representation and Objectivity

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A. B. Dickerson, Kant on Representation and Objectivity, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 217pp, $60 (hbk), ISBN 0521831210

Reviewed by Robert Howell, State University of New York, Albany


Kant’s Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, in the Critique of Pure Reason, justifies the objective validity of those fundamental a priori concepts. Dickerson offers a novel exegesis of the Critique’s second- (B-) edition version of the Deduction, the clearest development of Kant’s reasoning. Dickerson’s work should interest everyone concerned with the details of this, the central argument of the critical philosophy. For Dickerson, Kant is a representationalist. Representations are the immediate objects of our awareness. However, we cognize objects like trees neither by inferring those objects as the causes of representations nor by constructing them out of representations. Rather, via what Kant calls apperception we are made aware of the object cognized “in” the representation, just as we see a face “in” the lines of a picture. That object is distinct from the matter of the representation, just as the face is distinct from the lines themselves. Moreover, the lines do not determine their own interpretation; we must apply a rule of projection in order to grasp them as representing the face. Similarly, representations as given (impressions and empirical concepts) do not determine their own interpretation. For apperception to grasp the tree, an act of category-applying spontaneity is required (an act “not grounded upon the (passive) recognition of features of what is given in experience,” 37). This act is synthesis. In it, we apply a category-governed rule of projection and grasp the manifold as representing the tree. This application imposes an interpretation on our experience that our given experience does not ground. However, imposing this interpretation appears incompatible with the objectivity of cognition. The interpretation could be a fantasy; and even if we in fact use categories to interpret experience, what justifies that use as objective? Hence the Deduction’s “basic aim”: to demonstrate that, and how, our categorial interpretation of experience can be not only spontaneous but also objective (44). To meet this objective, the Deduction analyzes the concept of cognizing an object. It shows that, given that we cognize an object “in” a representation, category application is required to interpret that representation. Moreover, that application is objective, for it is grounded “only upon essential facts about the cognizing mind” (56) in such a way that any possible cognizing mind would synthesize given intuitions in the same way. Thus objectivity is reconciled with spontaneity. Dickerson presents this interpretation in chapters 1 and 2, summarizing the overall B-Deduction argument thus (51): α. All our cognition must involve a spontaneous synthesis. ß. If our cognition involves a spontaneous synthesis then this synthesis must be governed by the categories. ∴ The categories make our cognition possible. In chapter 3 he explains how B-Deduction §16 supports α and in chapter 4 how §§17-20 and §26 support b and the conclusion. It is here, and especially in chapter 3, that Dickerson offers some of his most striking exegeses. Dickerson sees §16—beginning with the famous claim that “the . think must be able to accompany all my representations”—as the “master argument” for α. Past interpreters (for example, Allison, Bennett, Guyer, Henrich, Patricia Kitcher and myself) suggest that §16 holds that I can be aware of each of the relevant representations as mine (or that any of my judgments can be made in the first person). Kant then argues that this self-awareness of representations as mine requires a synthesis: the “relation [of my representations] to identity of the subject” comes about “by my adding one representation to the other and being conscious of their synthesis” (B133). Dickerson rejects this interpretation. He regards Kant’s notion of apperception as Leibniz’s. For Leibniz and Kant, apperception is the reflexive awareness of representations. This awareness does not, however, grasp the representations in such a way that I explicitly become aware of them as mine. In cognition I apperceive my representation in thought; but the object of my thought is the object presented by the representation, not the representation itself. Dickerson holds that because the B-Deduction simply analyzes what is involved in cognition, §16 starts from the assumption that an object is cognized via a representation. Because it presents a single object, that representation is an intuition. Our apperception of the intuition thus just is—and does not simply imply—a synthesis. That synthesis from the start grasps the whole representation as representing the object. As so grasped, the intuition hangs together as a single representation offering a point of view on the world. Moreover, apperception “intimate[s]” (83) the viewpoint of this point of view—it is mine. So the intuition forms my point of view on the world. In that sense—and not because I am aware of the components of the manifold as mine—Kant speaks of the relation of my representations to “the identity of the subject.” In agreement with Bell and Hylton, Dickerson argues further that Kant’s apperceptive relation of representations to the identity of the subject is the representationalist equivalent of the idea of the “unity of the proposition,” an idea discussed later by Frege and Russell. For Frege, a judgment is prior to concepts. For Kant, a synthesized intuition is not a collection of component representations each of which I first grasp individually. Rather, in apperceptive synthesis I holistically grasp the unified representation and only then “segment” it into its components. Synthesis therefore does not combine given atomic elements. This synthesis is spontaneous, not a receptive grasp of component representations (122-23). Dickerson thus defends α. In chapter 4, he supports b. His basic account is familiar. His interpretation involves, however, at least two important novelties: (a) Having argued for unity of apperception in §16, in §17 Kant claims that “all unification of representations requires unity of consciousness in the synthesis of them. Consequently the unity of consciousness is that which alone constitutes the relation of representations to an object, thus their objective validity, and consequently is that which makes them into cognitions” (B137). This looks like a fallacious argument from unity of consciousness as necessary for the unification of representations to unity of consciousness as sufficient for that unification. Dickerson denies the fallacy. Kant is simply analyzing the concept of human cognition as achieved via a unified manifold of intuition. Kant holds that because that manifold relates to an object and yet, as given, has no determinate representational content, that relation must arise through unity of apperception. B137 in fact simply identifies unity of consciousness with unity of object. (Contrary to many interpreters, B137 also does not argue for a mutual implication between unity of apperception and unity of object.) (b) Suppose that the Deduction simply analyzes cognition, showing that it is constituted by the category-applying apperception of a given intuition. Then the most that the Deduction proves is that if we have cognition or objective experience, then the categories apply. This is not (as Ameriks has suggested) a regressive argument that begins from the premise that we do have cognition. But it is not antiskeptical either. A skeptic like Hume could grant the preceding conditional but deny its antecedent by noting that no proof has been offered that we have cognition of an object (206). To put the point in my own (Strawsonian) terms, why can’t our experience simply be a sense-datum stream of elements of the manifold, no object being experienced as common to and presented “in” those elements? Many scholars (for example, Wolff, Strawson, Guyer, Keller, myself) read the Deduction as arguing that we have cognition in the above sense. Dickerson demurs. If, in §17, Kant identifies a manifold unified in apperception with the cognition of an object, then he can hardly be arguing from such apperceptive unification to the manifold’s providing cognition. Moreover, even if the Deduction is not antiskeptical, it still has philosophical interest. Dickerson raises central questions about the B-Deduction, and his book should be read by anyone serious about understanding the Deduction’s argument. It is impossible to settle, here, all the issues that arise, but there are substantial grounds for doubting his interpretation. And although they are forcefully expressed, his criticisms of the literature are not always on target. (i) Describing the aim of the Deduction as reconciling objectivity with spontaneity seriously distorts the text. Kant stresses that the Deduction is to explain “the way in which concepts [the categories] can relate to objects . priori” (A85/B117). Dickerson connects the categories, as applied via apperceptive spontaneity, to this point. However, his stress on spontaneity plays down the fact that it is the . priority (and necessity) of the categories, already established in the Metaphysical Deduction—and not just their failing to represent conditions under which objects are given—that poses the initial Deduction problem. Moreover, a careful reading of A50/B74ff. shows that it is the faculty of thought—the faculty of operating with concepts—that is spontaneous; and thought operates with both empirical and a priori concepts. The spontaneous/nonspontaneous distinction simply does not line up with a distinction between the categories and all other elements of cognition (given representations, empirical concepts, and so on). (ii) Dickerson asserts (but argues only by appeal to what he sees as the success of his overall interpretation) that Kant in §16 adopts Dickerson’s Leibnizian account of apperception. But Kant was perfectly capable of thinking for himself, and his use of “I think” carries Cartesian overtones. Observe B422 note and A355 (and compare B-Deduction §25), where Kant notes the “designation” relation that he takes the . think to have to the subject of thoughts. (Of course, Kant, unlike Descartes, takes that designation to provide no information about the nature of that subject.) Moreover, Dickerson’s account of the “relation to the identity of the subject” as not involving the awareness of my representations as mine is belied by Kant’s saying, in a text whose present implications Dickerson does not discuss, that “only because I can comprehend [the manifold of representations] in a consciousness do I call them all together my representations” (§16, B134; first, third emphases mine; see also B135, B138, A122, and B408). Such passages (and texts like B133 on my representing to myself “the identity of the consciousness in these representations”) imply that, contrary to Dickerson, §16 is arguing to synthesis of the manifold from facts about “self-awareness [of representations as mine], [and] the reference of ‘I’” (97). (iii) Dickerson’s holism captures one strand in Kant’s complex account of synthesis. However, many texts support an atomistic view. Dickerson discusses one such (137, A163/B03-204). But other, more troublesome texts exist that Dickerson should have considered—for example, A162/B203 (an extensive magnitude is “that in which the representation of the parts makes possible the representation of the whole (and therefore necessarily precedes the latter)”) and A120 (“since every appearance contains a manifold, thus different perceptions by themselves are encountered dispersed and separate in the mind, a combination of them … is therefore necessary”). (iv) There is textual evidence that §17 does not simply identify unity of apperception with cognition of an object. Note the repeated “consequently” in the above B137 quote: Kant is saying that unity of consciousness holds with respect to the relevant representations, and consequently those representations relate to an object and constitute a cognition. This is the language of argument, not identification, and it means that interpreters are right to worry about a fallacy here. (v) Point (iv) also bears on the idea that the Deduction is not meant antiskeptically. The §17 “consequently,” taken together with the §16 interpretation that Dickerson rejects, suggests that Kant means to be considering, among other things, any manifold through which I can be said to cognize (even in what might be no more than a minimal, sense-datum way). Kant argues that because that manifold is subject to unity of apperception, it must be so united that through it I am aware of an object distinct from the individual elements of the manifold—in Dickerson’s terms, that manifold must be so united that through it I cognize an object. Note B158 (“cognition of an object distinct from me”); §26, where Kant takes one of the Deduction’s results to be that “all possible perceptions, hence everything that can ever reach empirical consciousness … stand under the categories” (B164-65, my emphases); and A111, A112, A121-22, A156/B195, on why the holding of unity of apperception rules out mere aggregations of representations as constituting cognition. Of course if §17 involved the identification Dickerson suggests, one reason for interpreting the B-Deduction as antiskeptical would collapse (207). However (as noted in (iv)), I find that view of §17 unconvincing. (vi) Dickerson’s ability to analyze the text and competing interpretations may have been hampered by space limitations outside his control. To some extent this would explain the brevity of many of his critical remarks. But, in his eagerness to forward his account and undermine those of others, problems arise. For example, Kemp Smith gets criticized for saying that, for Kant, “representation of the parts precedes and renders possible representation of the whole” (135). But this sentence just paraphrases Kant’s own A162/B203 claim about extensive magnitudes (quoted in (iii) above), as Dickerson doesn’t note or discuss further. Again, an important part of George’s article “Kant’s Sensationism” is dismissed in a one-line footnote (24); yet it presents ideas (ignored by Dickerson) that seem contrary to Dickerson’s holistic, nonconstructivist view of synthesis. This article also brings out (as Dickerson fails to remark) the relation of Kant’s to Frege’s view of judgment. Dickerson also misrepresents parts of my own book on the B-Deduction. At 102-104, in the course of noting that I find a certain fallacy in §16, he implies that I read Kant’s “principle of the unity of apperception” in a way that I expressly repudiate in three different places in the relevant chapter. At 195, he attributes to Allison, Henrich, and me a certain “absurd” idea about the relation of §20 and §26, and he objects to that idea. But he fails to indicate that in a long footnote three pages later I reply to just that objection. Given these and similar readings of the secondary literature, I hesitate to trust too far Dickerson’s other characterizations of previous scholarship. Dickerson’s book contains interesting interpretations, forcefully argued, which need careful evaluation. Whether they are correct or not, his accounts of apperception, synthesis, and the §§16-20 argument make a serious contribution to the literature. His view of the relation of Kant’s treatment of judgment to the problem of the unity of the proposition seems right (although I don’t believe that relation comes in directly in §16, as 107 implies). However, his work must be read with care. A number of important texts, not considered by Dickerson, run contrary to his account; and not all of his remarks on other interpretations are either complete or correct.