Kant on the Human Standpoint

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Béatrice Longuenesse, Kant on the Human Standpoint, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 316pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521834783.

Reviewed by Emily Carson, McGill University


This important volume collects together ten previously published essays, all of which were written following the publication of the author's Kant et le pouvoir de juger (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France) in 1995 and its expanded and revised English version Kant and the capacity to judge (hereafter, KCJ; Princeton: Princeton University Press) in 1998. Although the papers were written over an eight-year period, they display a remarkable thematic unity at various levels. As the title and the author's introduction suggest, they are unified at the most general level by the theme of the human standpoint in Kant. That standpoint is characterised by our possessing apriori modes of ordering representations: forms of intuition and forms of our capacity to judge. The priority in the first Critique of this latter notion, the capacity to judge, was the focus of the aforementioned book. What Longuenesse does in the papers collected here is to clarify and elaborate her claim for the centrality of this capacity, this time in Kant's Critical philosophy as a whole.

In the first of three parts, she addresses various criticisms that have been leveled against this claim as put forward in KCJ. This results in a significant clarification of some of the key theses of the earlier book concerning the three-fold relation between the logical functions of judgement, the categories, and the "affection of sensibility by the understanding". In the second part, Longuenesse elaborates the central interpretive claim -- that we must take seriously the relation between the logical forms of judgement and the pure concepts of the understanding -- by showing in great detail how this sheds light on different sections of the Transcendental Analytic, and on their development out of Kant's pre-Critical philosophy. In the final part of the book, Longuenesse exhibits the fruitfulness of this interpretive claim by extending it to the Transcendental Dialectic and Kant's account of moral and aesthetic judgement. Because this is such a rich and varied collection, I shall focus here only on how the unifying themes are developed in these different sections.

The stage is set in the first section where the key theses are clarified and defended. The first two papers address criticisms put forward by Henry Allison, Sally Sedgwick and Michael Friedman concerning the status of the categories on Longuenesse's view. Allison is concerned that Longuenesse seems to allow for genuine judgements (the judgements of perception of the Prolegomena) which do not involve an application of the categories, but rather merely involve the logical functions of judgement. For Allison, then, Longuenesse ends up attributing to the logical functions of judgement the "objectifying role" which is usually attributed to the categories: thus he asks "where have all the categories gone?" Sedgwick takes issue with Longuenesse's claim that the categories are generated out of acts of judging, and so are in no way prior to the act of judging. The various ways of understanding this claim, according to Sedgwick, undermine the apriority of the categories and, more importantly, Longuenesse's claim for the priority of the capacity to judge. Friedman attributes to Longuenesse a 'bottom-up' reading of the first Critique according to which the categories are derived inductively from experience by means of comparison, reflection and abstraction on the sensible given. Such a bottom-up reading, Friedman argues, fails to do justice to the role of the categories in determining the possibility of experience from the top-down, i.e., prior to any inductive generalization or empirical concept formation.[1]

Longuenesse addresses these objections by emphasizing the two distinct roles for the categories in her reading. Categories are both (i) rules for ordering sensible manifolds so that they can be reflected under concepts of objects in accordance with the logical functions of judgement and (ii) concepts under which we can think an object as determined with respect to a logical function of judgement. In this way, they play synthesizing roles "at both ends of the cognitive process" (p.23). In their first role, they guide the synthesis of intuitions, which precedes any analysis of those intuitions required for forming concepts; in their second role, objects are subsumed under them by means of the combination or synthesis of concepts in judgements. In the case of judgements of perception, for example, the categories play the first, but not the second role, but that is not to say that these judgements do not involve the categories. Similarly, the reply to Friedman's accusation of a 'bottom-up' reading is that the operations of comparison, reflection and abstraction presuppose this synthesis of sensible intuitions which is guided by the categories: "the role of categories as logical functions of judgement governing reflection capable of yielding concepts of objects presupposes their role as synthesis-determiners" (p.43).

So according to Longuenesse, both Allison and Friedman fail to recognise sufficiently the crucial role of this "pre-discursive act of synthesis of sensible manifolds". Allison, to be sure, acknowledges the two roles for the categories, but he describes the first as an application of the categories "only in a Pickwickean sense": they function at the initial stage only "under the guise of the logical forms" (Allison, p.69). What is at issue here is the functional distinctness of the logical forms of judgement and the categories; I'm not sure that this issue is settled in this book. Longuenesse grants here that some of her formulations "blur the distinction between logical functions of judgement and categories" (p.31).[2] The explanation for this is that "absent any sensible manifold, all that remains of the categories are logical functions of judgement" (ibid. and p.105). The logical functions of judgement "become categories … only when the understanding's capacity to judge is applied to sensible manifolds" thus combining them in intuition for analysis into concepts which in turn are synthesized in judgements (p.106). It seems then that the functional distinctness depends on how we understand the generation or production of the categories from the logical functions of judgement.

This latter issue comes up in connection with Sedgwick's concern about the compatibility of the generation of the categories with their apriority. In response to this concern, Longuenesse claims that the categories are generated in that their formation as concepts (both as rules of synthesis and as universal and reflected representations) requires that impressions "trigger" our cognitive powers to launch the effort to represent objects (p.29). They are nonetheless apriori in that their content is determined apriori by the logical functions of judgement together with the forms of intuition, which constitute the subjective conditions of spontaneity and receptivity, respectively. So although they are generated only under empirical conditions, their content is determined independently of these empirical conditions (ibid.).[3]

This may account for the apriority of the categories, but Sedgwick's more general and more fundamental concern was with Longuenesse's claim that the categories are in no way prior to the act of judging, and that they "result from this activity of generating and combining concepts according to logical functions of judgement" (KCJ, p. 199). It would seem that, on the contrary, if what is involved in this synthesis of the sensible manifold is the categories in any guise whatsoever (as the response to Allison requires) and not just the pre-categorial capacity to judge, then, as Sedgwick argues, the categories are in some sense prior to acts of judging, even if they are only realised or recognised in these acts. It is notable, I think, that we don't find this claim that the categories are not prior to the act of judging repeated in KHS. But does the absence of such a claim undermine the thesis of the priority of the capacity to judge, as Sedgwick suggests (Sedgwick, p.88)?

Here I think Longuenesse clarifies this priority thesis. The thesis she defends is that Kant defines the understanding as a capacity to judge and claims that all of its functions (concept formation, subsumption of instances under concepts or rules, syllogistic inference) can be traced back to its capacity to combine concepts according to the elementary forms set out in the Table of Judgements. The priority of the capacity to judge then consists in its being the "original capacity from which all aspects of the understanding are developed" (p.19). A particularly clear statement of this comes later in the book, where Longuenesse tells us that "the notion of an apriori form of intuition is meant to account for an original capacity to represent (anticipate, generate) homogeneous multiplicities (multiplicities of objects thought under the same concept)" and the table of logical functions accounts for "an original capacity to form universal concepts" (p.205). This seems to be a considerable weakening of the priority claim to which Sedgwick objected -- that acts of judging are prior to the categories. This is not to say that it is a weak claim, however: as the preceding quote shows, it is not only functions of the understanding which are traced back to the capacity to judge, but so are the apriori forms of intuition.

This brings us to a related thesis that is reworked in response to criticism in Part One, that is, the thesis that space and time are the products of the "affection of sensibility by the understanding" -- i.e., the figurative synthesis -- and so depend on spontaneity. Sedgwick and Allison both suggest that this seems to bring Longuenesse's Kant uncomfortably close to the German Idealist narrowing of the distinction between receptivity and spontaneity: this complaint is the main focus of her response to Michel Fichant in the third essay. This paper exhibits clearly what I take to be one of the main strengths of Longuenesse's approach to Kant, and that is her determination to take Kant's texts at face value even in the face of difficult passages where other commentators might throw up their hands and accuse Kant of confusion or ambiguity.[4] In this essay, the crucial text is the troublesome footnote at B161 in §26 of the Transcendental Deduction where Kant introduces the notion of a formal intuition that gives unity to the representations of space and time. Notoriously, Kant claims that this unity precedes all concepts while at the same time presupposing a synthesis. If synthesis is governed by the categories, then we have a puzzle as to how to understand this apparently preconceptual synthesis. The standard way to read this passage is to say that the representations Kant considers here are those of geometrical figures or spaces -- formal intuitions are determinate spaces like triangles and squares. Kant's claim that the unity precedes all concepts means only that the unity of the formal intuition precedes all concepts of space and time in that any concept of space, for example, presupposes the intuition of space. This is not to say that the unity precedes the categories, so there is no need to posit a preconceptual synthesis. For Longuenesse, however, the unity at issue is that of the representations of space and time themselves: it is one of her key theses that the representations of space and time are the products of such a preconceptual or prediscursive synthesis -- the transcendental synthesis of imagination -- which is the affection of sensibility by the understanding, that is, by the capacity to judge. In other words, just as the capacity to judge "generates" the categories, it "generates" the original representations of space and time as the conditions for representing homogeneous multiplicities. This illustrates again the explanatory thesis of the priority of the capacity to judge, and at the same time exemplifies another recurring theme, what Longuenesse describes as the cooperation of the passive and active aspects of our representational capacities. The general conclusion we should draw from this is that Kant's notion of the given is more complex than is generally supposed (p.38); but this cooperation does not deny the independence of sensibility from the understanding, as Fichant claims it does (p.65).

This sheds light on the surprising claim noted in n.4 above that the content of the categories is determined in part by the apriori forms of intuition. This seems to conflict with Kant's characterization of the categories as necessary conditions of any discursive thought whatsoever, regardless of the specific nature of sensibility. But in fact, what Longuenesse seems to be claiming is that the range of possible forms of sensibility is more restricted than might previously have been thought. On her view, the capacity to judge generates the unity, unicity[5] and infinity of space and time as conditions for judging, while the "qualitative features of spatiality and temporality" -- e.g., presumably the three-dimensionality of space and the holding of the parallel postulate -- depend on our sensibility (p.34). It follows that a unique and infinite space and time are necessary conditions for any discursive understanding. The categories then can both have their content determined by the apriori forms of intuition and nonetheless be conditions for any discursive thought whatsoever. Other forms of sensibility can differ only with respect to the qualitative features of space and time.

Having revised and clarified her interpretive thesis in the first part, Longuenesse turns in the second part to elaborating the key themes described above. In particular, one of her stated goals is to forestall objections like those considered in the first part by focusing attention more clearly on the second role of the categories -- that of guiding syntheses -- in particular arguments of the Transcendental Analytic. In the first two papers of this section, Longuenesse articulates her view of the development of the Critical philosophy out of Kant's pre-Critical questioning of the assumption shared by Wolff and his followers that logical relations between propositions "perfectly map" ontological relations between states of affairs. She sees Kant's transcendental philosophy as the culmination of his attempt to establish a new relation between logic and ontology: this relation is forged by the role of the categories in guiding syntheses. In 1763, Kant distinguishes between real and logical relations, and correspondingly between logical and real grounds. Thus we have on the one hand, for example, the logical relation of modus ponens, where the relation between antecedent and consequent in a hypothetical judgement is analytic, and the real relation between antecedent and consequent in an empirical hypothetical judgement, which is synthetic. But if the relation between antecedent and consequent in an empirical hypothetical judgement is not one of conceptual containment, what is its ground? This amounts to what Kant later calls 'Hume's problem' formulated in logical terms: how are we to understand a relation where, if something is posited, something else also is posited? Kant's severing of logic and ontology leaves this an open question. Kant proposes a solution in the Inaugural Dissertation of 1770, where he postulates a set of pure concepts that apply universally to objects; among these concepts is the concept of cause, which he takes to answer the question of the relation of antecedent to consequent in hypothetical judgements. But this leads to the famous question from the letter to Herz: how can concepts that have their origin in our minds apply to objects that are given?

Now although Kant has severed logic from ontology as described above, Longuenesse suggests that the Metaphysical Deduction represents Kant's attempt to establish a new relation between logic and ontology. The key Kantian insight, according to Longuenesse, is that the use of concepts in judgements and inferences -- which is the concern of general logic -- presupposes that the sensible manifold has been synthesized in such a way that it is capable of being thought under concepts. This synthesis must therefore be "guided by" the forms of judgement: thus we have Kant's claim that the same function that gives unity to representations in a judgement also gives unity to the synthesis of representations in an intuition. This function is called the pure concept of the understanding. In this way, the forms of judgement provide a leading thread to the categories, and Kant has established a new relation between logic and ontology. The detailed treatment of the argument of the Metaphysical Deduction in Chapter 4, together with the developmental story told in Chapters 4 and 5, corroborate Longuenesse's interpretive thesis that we can understand the meaning and role of the categories only when we understand their relation to logical forms of judgement. It is somewhat surprising that she did not offer such a detailed analysis of the Metaphysical Deduction in KCJ: these chapters therefore function as a focused and concise defence of the main thesis of that book.

The detailed treatments in chapters 6 and 7 of the Second and Third Analogies also serve to clarify the treatment of those Principles in KCJ, but they go on to explore further consequences of Longuenesse's reading. In Chapter 6, she relates her reading of the Second Analogy to the two dominant interpretive traditions, exemplified here by the interpretations of Buchdahl and Allison on the one hand and Michael Friedman on the other. She notes that these readings differ on two main issues. The first issue concerns whether the objective succession which is the subject of the Second Analogy is the succession of ordinary objects of everyday experience or whether it is the succession of states of affairs determined under scientific laws (e.g., the objective, as opposed to merely apparent, motions of the planets). The second issue concerns the strength of the causal principle: does it assert that for every event, there is a cause, or does it assert the stronger principle that this cause is determined under universal and strictly necessary laws? She notes that the two interpretive traditions seem to link these two issues, as if taking the relevant succession to be that of ordinary objects commits one to the weak reading of the causal principle, and taking the relevant succession to be of objects in the scientific context commits one to the strong reading. Longuenesse argues that there is no such link, and that the correct view is that Kant argues that we can perceive objective changes in the objects of ordinary perceptual experience only under the presupposition that they fall under strictly universal causal laws, and moreover, that in the world of appearances, all changes of state do fall under strictly universal causal laws.

Longuenesse's treatment here of the relation between the logical form of hypothetical judgement and the category of causality as implied by the argument of the Metaphysical Deduction is more explicit and therefore clearer than in KCJ. What is new here is the argument for the strong interpretation of the causal principle, which allows Longuenesse to return to and clarify another of the central themes in this collection, the importance of the cooperation between sensibility and understanding. Kant's ultimate answer to the question above (what is the ground of the relation between antecedent and consequent in an empirical judgement, if it is not one of concept containment?) is, according to Longuenesse, that it is the apriori intuition of a unified, continuous time in which every state of affairs and event has a completely determinate position. Although we have such a pure intuition, we do not perceive time itself. So the individuation of objects and events in time is effected, not by coordination in a temporal frame of reference, but by the rules of correlations of events. Thus, Longuenesse argues, these law-like correlations are the empirical realization of our pure intuition of time as unified, continuous and as the locus of complete determination of events and states of affairs. Because the unity of time requires that these correlations be preserved through time, the connection between the antecedent and the consequent of an empirical judgement should be thought of as necessary. Without these necessary connections according to strictly necessary causal laws, there would be no unity or continuity of empirically real time, and no complete determination of empirical events. So the strong necessity of the causal principle rests on the unity of time and not on its status as an apriori presupposition of Newtonian science, as Friedman would have it. Once again, we see that the treatment of space and time in the Transcendental Aesthetic is completed by considerations raised only in the Transcendental Analytic. The chapter concludes with the speculation that resistance to the strong interpretation of the causal principle results from this dependence of the argument on the features of the apriori intuitions of time and space and the conditions of their empirical realization.

Similarly in Chapter 7 Longuenesse presents the Third Analogy as setting out the acts of synthesis by which things are represented as in relations of universal causal interaction, and by which they are thereby individuated in space and time. The detailed analysis here is complemented by reflections on its broader significance. In particular, she takes her argument to show that the third category of relation is the central category for the entire Critical system. In describing it in the first Critique as the category of community as well as the category of reciprocal action, what Kant wants to emphasize is that objects belong "to one space, thus to one world-whole, and under one logical space of concepts" (pp.203-4). In this way, Kant shows how elementary functions of the mind -- of concept-formation and object-individuation -- account for the unity of both the everyday perceptual world and of the scientific view of the world: they allow us to "develop a standpoint on the whole whose elementary discursive form is the form of disjunctive judgement and the grounding concept, that of community" (pp.205-6).

The claim for the centrality of the category of community rests on its grounding role in the development of a standpoint on the whole, which is the unifying theme of Part Three. In Chapter 9, for example, Longuenesse goes on to describe how these same elementary functions of the mind can be related to impulses and desires instead of sensations: in this capacity, the elementary functions order "the desires and inclinations that drive us to act" (p.240), and thereby allow us to develop a moral standpoint on the whole, a kingdom of ends (p.263). In chapter 10, she suggests that the peculiar features of aesthetic judgement reveal in human beings a sensitivity to the "community of judging subjects" (p.290) which has the same apriori grounds as the capacities to develop moral and theoretical standpoints -- that is, the synthesizing activity of the subject. This synthesizing activity ultimately grounds Kantian judgements of taste. In this way, all three Critiques are said to invoke the capacity to develop a standpoint on the whole which is grounded in the category of community.

One might think (as many have thought) that taking so seriously the origins of the categories in the logical functions of judgement would render Kant's Critical philosophy a mere historical curiosity. On this point, Longuenesse offers interesting reflections on the contemporary relevance of Kant's conception of general logic and, consequently (on her view), of the Critical philosophy as a whole. That conception, she points out, is narrowly defined: it is concerned with the rules of the understanding as the faculty of concepts, so that Kant's forms of judgement are simply forms of concept subordination, and the forms of inference he is concerned with are just those involving concept subordination. Understood this way, Kant's general logic can be taken to describe "the forms according to which minds like ours are capable of universalization of their representations" (p.204).

I hope here to have given some indication of the range and importance of the issues discussed in Kant and the Human Standpoint. As is the case with most things Kantian, much remains to be clarified. I'm not sure that we get a satisfactory answer to the question of the functional distinctness of the logical forms of judgement and the categories. Despite having formulated the thesis of the priority of the capacity to judge somewhat more cautiously in light of Sedgwick's concerns, Longuenesse continues to speak of the generation or production of the categories (and of the forms of intuition), where perhaps it would be more appropriate to speak of relations of presupposition or determination. That there should remain obscurities or open questions, however, is not at all surprising given the scope and complexity of Longuenesse's reading of Kant. It is precisely this scope and complexity that issues in the remarkable fruitfulness of her interpretive thesis, as illustrated particularly in the final section of the book. Kant on the Human Standpoint is a demanding and very stimulating work which challenges us to reconsider all aspects of Kant's philosophy, and which therefore cannot fail to reinvigorate every aspect of Kant scholarship.[6]

[1] Longuenesse anticipates this 'bottom-up' objection in the introduction to KCJ, pp.11-12. In response, she claims that the role of the categories in determining the possibility of experience "can be understood correctly only in light of the objectifying role that Kant grants to the logical forms of judgement as forms of reflection". This of course is the point that Allison takes issue with: see next footnote.

[2] See for example the continuation of the passage quoted in n.1 above: "Categories before synthesis are nothing but mere forms of analysis, logical functions of judgement. But these 'mere forms of analysis' govern the synthesis of what they are to analyze. And only when the analysis is carried out can full-fledged categories, 'pure concepts of the understanding' … be applied to appearances", KCJ, p.12. This does make it sound as though the first role described above does not in fact involve the categories. It is presumably this sort of claim that has led to confusion.

[3] Note that their content is not determined altogether independently of sensible conditions. I take up this surprising claim a little bit more below.

[4]Many of Longuenesse's most controversial and original claims seem to come from precisely this attempt to make sense of difficult texts: another example mentioned above is Kant's distinction between judgements of perception and judgements of experience. Indeed, the entire reading stems from her determination to take seriously and, more importantly, to understand, Kant's claim that the logical forms of understanding provide a "guiding thread" for the categories.

[5] I take it that this is equivalent to the uniqueness of space and time.

[6] I'm grateful to Sally Sedgwick for comments.