Kant on the Sources of Metaphysics: The Dialectic of Pure Reason

Placeholder book cover

Marcus Willaschek, Kant on the Sources of Metaphysics: The Dialectic of Pure Reason, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 298pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108472630.

Reviewed by Eric Watkins, University of California, San Diego


In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant famously mounts an extensive critique of the claims and arguments of traditional metaphysics. In his book, Marcus Willaschek not only offers fresh new insights into the negative project of understanding the exact nature of Kant's criticisms of traditional metaphysics, but also undertakes the much neglected, but still quite important positive project of understanding what, according to Kant, naturally leads us to the kind of metaphysical speculation that gives rise to these arguments. The result is a terrific book, one that is clear, careful, and rich, but also subtle, original, and important. It is, in my view, one of the best books on Kant in a long time and is sure to have a significant impact on the field.

At the beginning of the first edition Preface to the first Critique, Kant claims:

Human reason has the peculiar fate in one species of its cognitions that it is burdened (belÃĪstigt) with questions which it cannot dismiss, since they are given to it as problems by the nature of reason itself, but which it also cannot answer, since they transcend every capacity of human reason. (Avii)

In this passage Kant is claiming that human reason is the source of metaphysical questions, that it cannot answer these questions since doing so would exceed its capacities, but also that it cannot dismiss these questions.[1] In response it is natural to wonder: Why does reason lead us to ask such metaphysical questions? What justifies reason in thinking that it is in a position to answer these questions? And why can reason not dismiss these questions, especially once it has been established that it is incapable of answering them?

The passage from the Preface continues as follows:

Reason falls into this perplexity (Verlegenheit) through no fault of its own. It begins from principles whose use is unavoidable in the course of experience and at the same time sufficiently warranted by it. With these principles it rises (as its nature also requires) ever higher, to more remote conditions. But since it becomes aware in this way that its business must always remain incomplete because the questions never cease, reason sees itself necessitated to take refuge in principles that overstep all possible use in experience, and seem so unsuspicious that even ordinary common sense agrees with them. But it thereby falls into obscurity and contradictions. (Avii-viii)

Kant's idea here is that reason is fully justified in asking its questions and in offering its answers, because it begins with experience and proceeds in accordance with its own nature "ever higher, to more remote conditions" on the basis of that firm foundation. Troubles arise when reason discovers that it can never answer these questions in a way that does not generate yet more questions, a situation it then attempts to remedy by adopting principles that go beyond all possible experience. The problem is that even though these principles appear to agree with common sense, by adopting them reason falls into obscurity and, even worse, generates contradictions. Kant's negative project in the Transcendental Dialectic describes these obscurities and contradictions and shows why a counter-intuitive sounding doctrine he calls Transcendental Idealism ends up being necessary to avoid these problems.

The primary focus of Willaschek's book is on Kant's view, expressed in the passages quoted above, that the sources of metaphysical speculation (both its questions and its answers) lie in human reason itself and in its own principles. He divides this view, which he dubs the Rational Sources Account, into three subclaims:

RS-1 Rational reflection on empirical questions necessarily raise metaphysical questions about 'the unconditioned.'

RS-2 Rational reflection (by 'pure reason') on these metaphysical questions necessarily leads to metaphysical answers that appear to be rationally warranted.

RS-3 The rational principles that lead from empirical to metaphysical questions and from there to metaphysical answers are principles of 'universal human reason'; that is, they belong to rational thinking as such. (p. 5)

According to Willaschek, human reason is characterized by three features (discursivity, iteration, and completeness) that, when taken together, justify RS-1, RS-2, and RS-3. First, human reason is discursive not only by actively processing a multiplicity of elements sequentially, but also by distinguishing between questions and answers, between what is grounded (the explanans) and what is a ground (the explanandum). Second, its explanations are iterative in the sense that if one offers an answer to a "Why?" question, one can, at least in principle, ask a further "Why?" question about that answer. Third, it has a need for completeness in the sense that reason cannot be satisfied until it reaches an answer to a "Why?" question about which one cannot ask a further "Why?" question.

Willaschek structures his discussion by arguing that the Rational Sources Account operates on four different levels. The first and most general level, which is the focus of Part One of his book, concerns the transition from the 'Logical Maxim' (LM) to the 'supreme principle of pure reason' (SP). The second, third, and fourth levels, which are the subject matter of Part Two, concern the system of transcendental ideas of reason, the dialectical (i.e., illegitimate) inferences reason is tempted to draw (as articulated by Kant's predecessors), and, in the context of scientific research, the legitimate regulative use of transcendental principles that are, on Willaschek's account, mistakenly taken to be constitutive in the dialectical inferences.

Willaschek locates the first level near the beginning of the Transcendental Dialectic, in the subsection of the Introduction entitled "On the Pure Use of Reason". There Kant describes the logical use of reason as being governed by a logical maxim, LM, which says that one should "find the unconditioned for conditioned cognitions of the understanding" (A307/B364). He then continues:

this logical maxim cannot become a principle of pure reason unless we assume that when the conditioned is given, then so is the whole series of conditions subordinated one to the other, which is itself unconditioned, also given (i.e., contained in the object and its connection). (A307-8/B364)

As Willaschek reads this "Transition Passage", the principle that must be assumed for LM to become a principle of pure reason just is the principle of pure reason and, in fact, the supreme principle of pure reason, i.e., SP, which he interprets as asserting: if the conditioned exists, then so too does the totality of its conditions and thus the unconditioned. Crucially, according to Willaschek, the Logical Maxim presupposes the Supreme Principle, and when one moves from LM to SP, one is moving from universal human reason to metaphysical speculation. This transition is discussed in the first five chapters. The first chapter is devoted to Kant's conceptions of reason and metaphysics, which provide the content of and context for the Rational Sources Account by describing how reason is discursive, iterative, and complete and how that conception fits naturally with Kant's understanding of the nature of metaphysical speculation. The second chapter clarifies how LM is to be understood, the third describes the content of SP, the fourth provides a detailed interpretation of the Transition Passage, while the fifth offers an explanation of what is and what is not justified in the Transition Passage's move from LM to SP.

Since the second, third, and fourth levels depend heavily on the first, I will devote most of my attention to chapters two through five, which articulate this first level in detail. In the second chapter, Willaschek explains how LM follows from Kant's conception of the logical use of reason in rational inferences (e.g., syllogisms), which are at home in empirical questions and empirical answers. Willaschek holds, along with others, that the logical use of reason concerns the inferential relations that obtain between cognitions in rational inferences, and that Kant views the premises of such rational inferences as conditions and the conclusion as conditioned. Since reason in its logical use is interested in finding the highest, most general cognitions from which the more specific cognitions follow, it is supposed to find the unconditioned cognition(s) for any conditioned cognition, that is, the highest, most general cognition(s) that cannot be derived from any others. Willaschek also holds, however, that reason, even in its merely logical use, aims at "a scientific system of cognition" (p. 62), and that it is therefore interested not only in what is inferentially unconditioned, but also in what is epistemically unconditioned. Thus, on Willaschek's reading, by saying that one should find the unconditioned, LM is stating that one should seek those cognitions that are both most general (inferentially unconditioned) and self-evident (epistemically unconditioned). He concludes this chapter by making the philosophical case that LM is in fact grounded in universal human reason (albeit in a form that is slightly weaker than what Kant claims).[2]

In the third chapter, Willaschek describes in detail the real (as opposed to the logical) use of reason that is at issue in SP. Unlike logical conditioning relations, which obtain between cognitions and have a common genus (truth-preserving inferential and epistemological relations among cognitions), real conditioning relations obtain between objects (broadly construed) and, according to Willaschek, have no "substantial unity" (p. 86) since they cannot be defined in terms of necessary or sufficient conditions, but are rather disjunctive in nature and are built out of the relational categories (inherence, dependence, and concurrence). Still, they are unified in the sense that something is conditioned (and thus stands in a conditioning relation to its conditions) if it stands in need of explanation in some respect (which the conditions supply). For example, a real whole is conditioned insofar as it stands in need of explanation in terms of its parts (its compositional conditions) and the composition relations that the parts stand in, while one moment of time is conditioned insofar as it stands in need of explanation in terms of the moments of time that precede it and the temporal relations that they stand in. Given this account of real conditioning relations, Willaschek is in a position to explain the meaning of SP: if something is really conditioned, then, given the nature of real conditioning relations, there must be a complete explanation in terms of the totality of that thing's conditions, which in turn entails the existence of something unconditioned, that is, something that does not stand in need of further explanation. Though Willaschek considers whether SP might be justified in virtue of the meaning of the various concepts that are central to it (e.g., the conditioned, the totality of its conditions, and the unconditioned), he holds as a textual matter that Kant provides no explicit argument for SP other than what it receives from LM and the Transition Passage.[3]

In his subtle and highly original interpretation of the Transition Passage in the fourth chapter, Willaschek argues that the transition from LM to SP involves two logically distinct steps. Given the rhetorical structure of the first Critique, Kant is, Willaschek contends, deliberately ambiguous about these two steps at the start of the Dialectic so that he can leave open whether SP is a legitimate principle. Later, after his critical analysis of the particular arguments presented throughout the Transcendental Dialectic he can reveal the ambiguity and show which step is proper and which is not. Specifically, the first step moves from LM to a regulative use of SP, and is legitimate, while the second step moves from the regulative use of SP to its constitutive use, and is illegitimate. SP is being used regulatively, on Willaschek's account, when one assumes it problematically as a "metaphysically harmless" hypothesis that one employs in reasoning so as to see what follows from it that might confirm it, while it is being used constitutively when one takes it to be a true description of reality.[4]

In chapter five, Willaschek reconstructs the line of reasoning that is supposed to justify the first step and to show the second step to be illegitimate. The first step is justified, according to Willaschek, in virtue of two main thoughts. First, he suggests that if one abstracts from the real conditioning relations between objects and focuses only on the logical relations between cognitions, one cannot achieve the kind of unified system of scientific knowledge of nature that reason strives for in its logical use, since the logical use taken on its own underdetermines such a system (p. 128). (I take it that this means that, given the goal Willaschek attributes to it, the logical use of reason presupposes its real use, despite their differences.) Second, since a complete scientific system of cognitions goes beyond any cognitions one might have at any particular time, one must also adopt hypotheses that will help fill in whatever gaps remain among one's cognitions. Willaschek argues that the regulative use of SP is necessary to fill in these gaps, because if we hypothetically assume that the conditions exist for whatever conditioned objects we cognize and are compelled to search for them, we can acquire the relevant cognitions (pp. 130-1). Kant's argument for the second step, according to Willaschek, is that if one accepts Transcendental Realism, understood here as the doctrine that there is a necessary correspondence between the principles of reason and the principles of reality, then SP will be a descriptive principle and not simply one that has a regulative use. Since, however, Kant argues that Transcendental Realism is false, he can also maintain that the argument for the second step, which relies on it, is illegitimate, though it is also inevitable, given the natural pull it exerts on us.

In Part Two, Willaschek discusses the second, third, and fourth levels described above. Chapter six discusses the second level, which concerns Kant's derivation of what he calls ideas of reason, including not only the idea of the unconditioned in general, but also ideas of specific unconditioned objects, such as the world as containing complete composition, division, origin, and dependence, the soul as a simple, unified, spiritual substance, and God as an ens realissimum. Willaschek's main interest here is to show that rational reflection gives rise to these ideas by way of "necessary inferences of reason" (A339/B397), and he does so by considering what an "inferred concept" (A310/B366) is and how they arise from the dialectical inferences that Kant analyses in Book Two of the Dialectic. This contrasts with other approaches, which attempt to derive these ideas from the different kinds of rational inferences or from the possible relations between subject, object, and representation (A333-4/B390-1).

Chapters seven and eight discuss the third level by considering the actual inferences that Kant presents, analyzes, and then criticizes in the Paralogisms and the Antinomy of Pure Reason (chapter seven) and the Ideal of Pure Reason (chapter eight). In line with his focus on the positive side of Kant's project, Willaschek devotes himself to showing how these ideas can be understood as necessary concepts of reason that are actually inferred by means of these arguments, but he also describes how Transcendental Realism plays a crucial role in these arguments (especially in diagnosing the fallacy they commit). In the second half of chapter eight, Willaschek addresses the fourth level by discussing the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic. Specifically, Willaschek focuses on how principles that are valid in a regulative sense (e.g., for the practice of science) can come to have an illusory use when one is not aware that the ideas of reason are merely products of our own reason, which are not necessarily responsive to objective features of reality, but rather only to reason's own need for unity and systematicity.

The final chapter, nine, argues that Kant's criticisms of metaphysics do not depend on a prior commitment to Transcendental Idealism. Specifically, according to Willaschek, Kant's main criticisms of traditional metaphysics are threefold. (1) We cannot cognize the supersensible objects of traditional metaphysics given that human cognition is limited to empirical objects; (2) the arguments offered by Kant's predecessors are not sound because they presuppose Transcendental Realism, which is false; and (3) the ideas of reason lack "objective reality", which is necessary for cognition. Willaschek argues that the first criticism depends not on Transcendental Idealism, but rather on Kant's views on cognition, namely that we cannot have cognition without intuition, which, for us, is sensible, and that entails that we cannot have cognition of the supersensible objects of traditional metaphysics. Regarding the second criticism, Willaschek argues that although the arguments of Kant's predecessors do presuppose Transcendental Realism, his criticisms of these arguments need not presuppose Transcendental Idealism, because Transcendental Idealism and Transcendental Realism are, Willaschek contends (controversially), contraries, not contradictories.[5] Finally, he argues for a radical reading of the claim that ideas of reason are cognitively defective not simply because one cannot tell whether claims that involve them are true but also because they do not represent really possible objects at all, a view that does not depend on Transcendental Idealism.

From this summary, it is, I hope, clear that Willaschek's book presents a sustained and detailed interpretation of one crucial strand of Kant's argument in the Transcendental Dialectic, an interpretation that is rich, original, interesting, and, at times, provocative. It will certainly move the conversation about Kant's views on reason and metaphysics several significant steps forward. For example, no one before Willaschek has presented a full case, much less a compelling one, for Kant's positive claims about how human reason is supposed to generate speculative metaphysical questions. Although Michelle Grier deserves credit for drawing attention to the Transition Passage and for providing a helpful interpretation of some of its aspects, Willaschek has provided a detailed analysis of the logical and real uses of reason, which makes clear their distinctness and their relations, and a subtle and sophisticated reconstruction of what steps are and are not justified in the transition from the one to the other before then showing how these abstract ideas figure in concrete arguments throughout the course of Kant's discussion in the Transcendental Dialectic.[6]

At the same time, Willaschek's book may not be the final word on the matter insofar as one can imagine different interpretive paths through the thicket of Kant's positive and negative arguments in the Dialectic. For example, one might not read the Transition Passage (quoted in full above) as claiming that SP is a necessary condition of LM, much less as proposing any kind of consideration that is supposed to make the move from LM to SP appear tempting. It is not just that the wording of the Transition Passage is brief and obscure. For it does not state SP explicitly, referring instead to a principle that must be assumed such that LM "becomes" SP; it does not clarify how LM is related to SP; and it does not offer an explicit justification that would actually support viewing the one as a necessary condition of the other. In addition, Willaschek's reconstruction of the argument requires that the purely logical use of reason aim at the ambitious goal of attaining the systematic cognition of nature (science), although one might think that the logical use of reason, properly speaking, aims only at merely logical (inferential) conditioning relations and thus at logical systematicity, and that only the real use of reason can have the more ambitious goal of cognizing the real conditioning relations among objects that could (eventually) amount to natural science.[7] Further, in the Transition Passage Kant might simply be pointing out, much as he does in the Metaphysical Deduction, some kind of analogy or correspondence between the logical and real uses of reason, using the clarity one has regarding the former as a guiding thread (Leitfaden) to see certain features of the latter. While such an alternative path might sound like a significant departure, it concerns only the first level of Willaschek's account and is consistent with much of its second, third, and fourth levels.

Setting this issue aside, Willaschek's proposal for understanding SP in two different ways, one as having a regulative use and the other as having a constitutive use, is a subtle and tempting way of reading the Transition Passage and then the rest of the Transcendental Dialectic. It would be nice if there were more unambiguous and direct textual support for it prior to the Appendix where Kant discusses the distinction between the constitutive and regulative uses of principles in detail. As it is, one could pursue other interpretive possibilities. For example, instead of positing constitutive and regulative uses of a single principle, one might think that Kant has in mind (implicitly) both a regulative (and non-descriptive) version of SP (for any conditioned object of cognition, seek cognition of the unconditioned condition(s) of it) and a transcendental (and descriptive) version (for every conditioned object, there is an unconditioned object). One could then consider whether Kant accepts either or both of these principles, whether these principles can be supported by arguments (and if so, which ones), and whether they are unified by some higher principle of reason (e.g., as a faculty of comprehension or intelligibility). Such an alternative path would naturally have to face a host of textual and philosophical questions of its own, but it would not have to rely as heavily on a passage that can appear to be elliptical, and Willaschek's discussion could still offer much that would be of great use, and not only by way of contrast.

Finally, Willaschek's "radical" interpretation of Kant's criticisms of metaphysics is likely to be viewed as controversial.[8] All will agree that, according to Kant, an idea of reason is cognitively defective in some way, but there is significant disagreement about what the cognitive defect is and what is responsible for it. According to Willaschek, the defect is that such an idea does not represent an object at all, and its cause is the purely subjective origin of the idea (plus the lack of an explanation of how it could relate to an object). However, on this reading, given that we would not be representing any object at all (except symbolically and analogically) when using, e.g., the term "God" or "simple", one might wonder how an idea of reason could be a central part of the questions and answers of speculative metaphysics, even on the weaker kind of hypothetical assumption (Annehmung) that Willaschek proposes, since such questions and answers seem to presuppose that we are representing objects (and not in a merely symbolic and analogical way).[9] One might hold instead that an idea of reason can represent an object, such as a simple substance, straightforwardly (e.g., by means of marks), even if it cannot be involved in cognition of its object, since one can, it seems, think it. Such a reading would even be consistent with the primary thrust of Willaschek's Rational Sources Account, since the questions and answers that constitute metaphysical speculation could operate with ideas that have meanings and represent objects (e.g., if the requisite objects exist in the way in which they are represented), even if we lack the cognition that would show how these ideas can represent their objects.

Regardless of the path one takes in interpreting Kant's complex position and argumentation in the Transcendental Dialectic, however, Willaschek's book is a major contribution to our understanding of Kant's position, one from which all interested in the topic will benefit greatly. It offers the first full-length discussion of Kant's positive project in the Transcendental Dialectic, provides detailed analyses of aspects of Kant's position that have been either misunderstood or neglected, and advances a sophisticated and sustained understanding of the Supreme Principle of Pure Reason and the role it plays in Kant's theoretical philosophy.

[1] Hereafter, I will refer to "human reason" simply as "reason".

[2] Willaschek notes that his Rational Sources Account follows from his conception of pure speculative reason, and thus that what must be shown in detail is that the ordinary use of reason tends to lead to its pure speculative use.

[3] Willaschek's discussion of real conditioning relations and SP is, I think, exceptionally good. It is detailed, clear, innovative, and absolutely central to the subject matter of the Transcendental Dialectic. My own view, which is closer to Willaschek's on many fundamental points than one might think, is that before determining the nature of Kant's critique of metaphysical speculation, it can be helpful to determine whether SP is true and can be supported by argument -- a question that Willaschek leaves open (p. 155). For if Kant endorses SP, one need not look for the mistake speculative metaphysicians are allegedly making in arguing for SP.

[4] This application of the constitutive-regulative distinction is, to the best of my knowledge, original to Willaschek, especially his claim that what reason requires is that we hypothetically assume SP, without taking it to be a true description.

[5] This argument naturally depends on how one understands Transcendental Realism. To this end, Willaschek formulates Transcendental Realism in this context as TRrep: "Necessarily, if some object o, in order to be represented (by finite beings like us), must be represented as being F, then o is F". He then helpfully distinguishes it from metaphysical realism, and shows how it relates to other versions of Transcendental Realism.

[6] See Michelle Grier, Kant's Doctrine of Transcendental Illusion, Cambridge University Press, 2001.

[7] As we saw above, Willaschek clearly distinguishes between the logical and real uses of reason, even noting that there is no direct mapping of the one onto the other (pp. 131-2), but he argues that they are also not completely distinct activities and that "the Supreme Principle corresponds to the Logical Maxim, namely, insofar as the former is the most general substantive principle, and in that the conditioning relations captured by the former are represented in the system of cognitions governed by the latter" (p. 133). Whether that kind of correspondence suffices to show that LM presupposes SP is a further question. Further, the issue appears in a different light if one were to take the logical use of reason as such to require only inferential and not epistemic relations.

[8] In part, this is because it implicitly criticizes the practice of those contemporary analytic metaphysicians who define terms without considering how they relate to objects.

[9] This issue is complicated by the fact that Willaschek (rightly) distinguishes between logical and real possibility, but then presupposes that one can represent an object only if it is really possible. On this interpretation, Kant can seem to be begging the question against opponents who think that they can represent, say, God, even if they know only that their concept of God is logically possible, and cannot establish that God is a really possible object.