Kant's Anatomy of Evil

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Sharon Anderson-Gold and Pablo Muchnik (eds.), Kant's Anatomy of Evil, Cambridge UP, 2010, 251pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521514323.

Reviewed by Robert Gressis, California State University, Northridge



Kant’s Anatomy of Evil is a collection of ten essays dedicated to interpreting, assessing, and applying Kant’s theory of evil. According to its editors, Sharon Anderson-Gold and Pablo Muchnik, the collection has two purposes: first, “to explore the intellectual resources available in Kant for dealing with the question of evil” (2); second, to shift contemporary ethicists’ attention from justifying morality to “understanding how perfectly justified judgments are so easily disregarded by self-serving calculations” (1). In this review, I shall concentrate on three topics that take up significant space within the book: (I) how Kant understands an evil will; (II) why Kant thinks that everyone is, in some sense, evil; and (III) how Kant’s theory of evil depicts the social dynamics of immorality.

What Is an Evil Will?

Claudia Card’s “Kant’s Moral Excluded Middle”, is a criticism of and response to what she calls Kant’s “excluded middle thesis” (77). This is the denial that “there is anything intermediate between a good will and an evil one” (75). As I read her, Card interprets Kant as holding to the excluded middle thesis on the basis of the following argument: (i) either an individual makes it his fundamental commitment to follow the moral law, or he does not; (ii) anyone who makes following the moral law his fundamental commitment is good, and anyone who does not is evil; therefore (iii) an individual’s will is either good or evil — it cannot be neutral (neither good nor evil) nor mixed (good in some ways and evil in others) (77).

Against the excluded middle thesis, Card claims there are “five commonly recognized ways that we often judge individuals to be either [neutral] or [mixed]” (81). First, there can be weak-willed individuals. Even while weak-willed individuals act immorally, they judge that they should not, which indicates that they are not evil, as Card interprets Kant as thinking, but are instead intermediate (81-82). (I should say, I doubt that Kant thinks that morally frail individuals are evil in virtue of their frailty, for he says that a person is frail when she "incorporate[s] the good (the law) into the maxim of [her] power of choice; but this good … is subjectively … the weaker (in comparison with inclination) whenever the maxim is to be followed" (6:29, italics mine).)1

Second, there are people who deliberately act immorally only when it causes little harm. This possibility points to a weakness in Kant’s account of evil: it makes no distinction between major and minor harms, and it is plausible that to count as evil, you have to be willing to deliberately commit major harms. So, a person who deliberately causes minor harms — say, stealing a little bit from rich people who will not notice it — may be unscrupulous, but it seems overkill to call her evil (83-86).

The third kind of moral intermediary is the moral flip-flopper, someone who has no fundamental commitment to morality or anything else. Such a person would be unreliable, but would not act immorally in any principled way, so it sounds implausible to call him evil (87-88). The fourth kind of intermediary is the Jekyll/Hyde character, who, rather than having no fundamental commitment, has a fundamental commitment that is hard to categorize as good or evil. Card gives as an example the father of Sue William Silverman, a man who did things both morally admirable (e.g., playing a key role in establishing Philippine independence, among many other things) and abominable (repeatedly sexually abusing his daughter from the age of four on) (88-91). Finally, there is the person stuck in what Card, following Primo Levi, calls a “gray zone.” An example of a person in a gray zone would be someone who deliberately committed intolerable harm against others in order to avoid suffering unbearable harm herself. Again, it seems too rigid to call such a person evil (91-92).

Card’s criticisms generally take the form, “Kant’s theory of evil says that people are either good or evil; it is implausible to call person of type T good, but it is just as implausible to call her evil; therefore, Kant’s theory of evil, which says she is evil, is defective.” But why is it implausible to call, say, the moral flip-flopper evil? Presumably, because we think of evil people as both rare and monstrous. Since on Kant’s theory evildoers are both common and, well, like us, it must be missing something.

In his outstanding “Kantian Moral Pessimism” (chapter 2), Patrick Frierson argues that much contemporary ethical theorizing operates under the assumption of “moral optimism”, “the view that humans are generally good” (33). Frierson finds evidence for this in the work of John Doris and Barbara Herman. Briefly, Doris takes social psychology to show that the average person is prepared to do awful things, and concludes from this that the average person is a creature of circumstance. But why not instead conclude, as Kant does, that the average person is bad (34-38)? Herman has drawn our attention to rules of moral salience (RMS), the rules that tell us what is of moral importance in any situation. According to Herman, most immorality results from defective RMS; since most RMS are formed in childhood, and so are generally beyond agents’ control, it follows that most ethical breaches are in fact ones for which most agents are not particularly culpable, if at all. Kant departs from Herman’s optimism by holding that agents typically try to form for themselves RMS that make their moral duties easier, and this for the reason that most (or all) people have bad wills (38-42).

Besides exposing how moral optimism quietly shapes ethical discussion, Frierson also uses a debate between Bernard Williams and Herman to show how a moral pessimist does ethics. Williams thinks that reasons for action stem ultimately from fundamental commitments, because fundamental commitments are constitutive of one’s character. Since on Kantian morality it is always possible that one may have to sacrifice one’s fundamental commitments for the sake of morality, it follows that morality could make a demand on an agent that she could have literally no reason to follow. Consequently, Williams thinks we should reject Kantian morality. Against this, Herman claims that agents can make morality their fundamental commitment, while still being able to satisfy their desires (42-48).

Frierson thinks Williams is right that Kantian morality could require agents to sacrifice their fundamental commitments, but he agrees with Herman that agents are capable of making morality their fundamental commitment. Still, making morality one’s fundamental commitment is much harder than Herman lets on, for Frierson seems to hold that all actual human beings at least start out as evil, which means that as long as they are evil they are almost non-negotiably committed to certain non-moral projects, such as supporting their families, advancing their careers, etc. Consequently, though Herman is right that every agent is capable of becoming devoted to doing the right thing, becoming such a person requires “a long, slow, painful suicide of one’s deepest commitments” (47-48).

Thus, Card’s criticisms are motivated by a moral optimism according to which it is hard to be evil. Frierson’s defense is motivated by a moral pessimism according to which it is hard to be good.2

Why Think Everyone Is (in Some Sense, Anyway) Evil?

One thing that Frierson does not really address in his essay is why we should think that actual human beings (all human beings, it seems) are evil.3 In an infamous remark in his Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (the place where Kant most fully presents his theory of evil), Kant says that "[w]e can spare ourselves the formal proof that there must be … a corrupt propensity [to evil] rooted in the human being, in view of the multitude of woeful examples that the experience of human deeds parades before us" (6:32-33).4 The problem with this remark is that in attributing a propensity to evil to all people, Kant seems to be making a synthetic, a priori claim. Yet the evidence he gives for it seems to be empirical, which Kant of all people knew to be an inappropriate justification for such claims.

Robert Louden, in his “Evil Everywhere: The Ordinariness of Kantian Radical Evil”, disputes the notion that Kant is making a synthetic, a priori claim here.5 But if Kant is not making such a claim, then what kind of claim is he making? Louden thinks that to understand what Kant is doing, we have to see Religion as supplementing Kant’s anthropological writings. When doing anthropology, Kant reaches conclusions about human nature based on the observed tendencies of people in all times and places. Furthermore, Kant engages in such research to offer “a practical guide by means of which human beings are to orient themselves toward both the present and the future” (113).

Seen in this light, Kant relies on empirical observation to establish the universality of the propensity to evil not because he sees positing a propensity to evil as a necessary precondition of moral experience, but rather because he wants to let human beings know what they have to deal with in order to develop the species’s capacities. This still does not answer the question of why we have to see every individual as having a propensity to evil, but perhaps Louden could respond that there is no other way to figure out what human (as opposed to rational) nature is than to observe the general tendencies of the species as a whole, and moreover we have no good reason to exempt any individual human being from having the same nature as her species-mates.

Against Louden, Muchnik claims in “An Alternative Proof of the Universal Propensity to Evil” that the claim that everyone has a propensity to evil is indeed a synthetic, a priori claim, and so requires a transcendental argument (127). But he brings an important nuance to his argument that Louden (and Card and Frierson) does not include:6 there is a difference between the propensity to evil and what Kant calls the evil "Gesinnung" (disposition). The propensity to evil is “the propensity to subordinate the demands of duty to the claims of happiness” (123), and is consequently what allows for individuals to actually subordinate duty to happiness (or more precisely, to not be fully committed to morality), which is just what it is to have an evil disposition.

Kant claims that every human being, “even the best”, has a propensity to evil (6:30),7 and it is this, along with the fact that a propensity to evil could not be analytic,8 that convinces Muchnik that Kant intends the claim that everyone has a propensity to evil to be a synthetic, a priori claim. In addition, the fact that propensities to evil and evil dispositions are distinct is crucial to seeing why Kant’s claim that the propensity to evil is universal cannot, as Louden argues, be an empirical claim for it is only the exhibition of an evil disposition that shows that an individual has a propensity to evil. But sometimes evil dispositions, even if present, are not exhibited (a person may not be fully committed to morality, but may luckily never violate a duty). Such evil dispositions would be indistinguishable from good dispositions on the empirical level, so for all we know from observation, some individuals have propensities to evil and the evil dispositions they enable while others have good dispositions because they do not have propensities to evil (133).

So what is Kant’s transcendental argument for the ubiquity of the propensity to evil? Muchnik claims that Kant has two: one based on empirical observation (which fails), and one hidden in the Preface to the Religion (which more or less succeeds). The argument Muchnik claims to find in the Preface is quite challenging, so I am not sure I am fairly representing it, but here goes: human beings know they are supposed to act from respect, but because they have needs, they cannot help but want to be happy. If it were impossible both to be happy and to do one’s duty, then we would face a rationally irresolvable practical dilemma. So, to empower us to act, practical reason comes up with the idea of the highest good, a world where everyone is perfectly virtuous and perfectly happy because of their virtue. However, people suffer the natural limitation of having to represent the outcome of their action in order to be able to act. Consequently, people have to represent the highest good before they can act from respect, which means they must represent a state of affairs in which they are happy before they act from respect. It is very easy to move from this subjective order of representing things to concluding that one ought to act morally because it will make one happy, and at this point, one has a propensity to evil. Since we have no reason for exempting anyone from this dialectic, we should conclude that everyone has a propensity to evil (137-42). This is not a purely transcendental argument (Muchnik calls it a “quasi-transcendental argument”), since it requires us to attribute natural limitations to the way people reason, but it nonetheless gets one to the conclusion that everyone has a propensity to evil.

Assuming I am not misrepresenting Muchnik (though I suspect I am), one must question two things about his argument. First, though Kant says that one must represent the outcome of one’s particular action to act, it is not clear to me that Kant is committed to the further view that individuals have to represent an outcome as general as the highest good, i.e., what results from everyone’s living a moral life. Second, I do not see why all individuals will end up seeing morality as instrumental to happiness once they represent to themselves the state of affairs of everyone’s being happy because they are virtuous. We may have no reason to exempt anyone from this mistake, but equally I see no reason to think that everyone makes this mistake.

Criticisms aside, I believe Muchnik is right about there being a distinction between the propensity to evil and the evil disposition, and about Kant’s using a quasi-transcendental argument to support his assertion that everyone has a propensity to evil.

What Is the Relationship between Evil Individuals and an Evil Society?

Regardless of whether Kant maintains the ubiquity of the propensity to evil on the basis of an empirical or of a quasi-transcendental argument, we still need to know what its universality means for us. This is one of the questions Allen Wood addresses in “Kant and the Intelligibility of Evil”, which tackles the question of the extent to which evil can be made intelligible to us. He argues persuasively that it cannot be made fully intelligible, at least if you assume that “evil is something we have decisive reasons for not doing” (147); for if evil is indeed something that everyone has overriding reason against doing, then we cannot explain why anyone does it in terms of reasons (what can anyone’s reason be for doing something she has decisive reasons against doing?) or in terms of causes (for causes are not themselves evil or good) (148-50).

It does not follow from the fact that evil cannot be made fully intelligible that it cannot be made intelligible at all. And indeed, though Wood thinks that evil can never be fully explained, he does think it can be extensively characterized, and this in two ways: first, we can characterize the pattern of reasoning or maxim that all evil actions (from the “merely bad” to the “really evil” (156)) have in common (Wood calls the problem of figuring out the common underlying maxim of evil actions "the maxim problem" (150)); second, we can explain why evil is so prevalent in human life, and what this means for us (Wood dubs the task of figuring these things out "the propensity problem" (150 and 158)).

Wood’s answer to the maxim problem is straightforward and uncontroversial: “evil lies not in which incentives we incorporate into our maxim, but in the order of priority among them” (152). More precisely, someone acts evilly when she subordinates the incentives of morality to the incentives of self-love. Where Wood’s discussion really shines is his treatment of the variety of ways in which self-loving incentives can be prioritized over moral ones, in particular the surprising extent to which Kant allows that people can act immorally for the reason that it is immoral (152-57). Unfortunately, giving this section the attention it deserves would take me too far afield.

It is Wood’s answer to the propensity problem that is most controversial. Wood claims that the propensity to evil — the “propensity for the contra-rational choice that inverts the rational order of incentives, placing the incentives of self-love or inclination ahead of those of moral reason” (158) — emerges out of the predisposition to humanity. The predisposition to humanity is that part of human nature that gives rise both to the notion of an overall material condition (i.e., how one is doing overall, in a non-moral sense) and to desires to protect it from others’ attempts to undermine it. The problem is, people in society very easily move from wanting merely to defend their circumstances from others to wanting to see their lot in life superior to others’ — after all, one sure way to protect your material condition from others’ attempts to diminish it is to make sure you are doing better than they are. It is at this point that the predisposition to humanity gives rise to the propensity to evil (159-60).

This account explains the prevalence of the propensity to evil (and so it can stand as another take on Kant’s argument for the universality of the propensity to evil), but it does not yet get at its “meaning”. The meaning of the propensity to evil is two-fold. First, it is the propensity to evil, or what is in Wood’s view the same thing, unsociable sociability, that allows for the development of civilization and reason: it is mainly because everyone in society tries to improve his material condition, and so competes with each other, that social institutions develop, technology improves, culture deepens, and so on (162-63).9

Second, the fact that the propensity to evil stems from our desire to have our material condition be superior to others’ allows us to understand just what makes vice immoral in the first place: ultimately, immorality stems from seeing the value of your condition, rather than the value of your person (i.e., one’s moral worth), as the paramount fact about you. Thus, Wood claims he is not committed to reading Kant as holding that all immorality is ultimately about wanting to be superior to others. If this were his view, he would be unable to adequately characterize at least some violations of duties to oneself; as things stand, though, he can give a plausible portrayal of, for example, suicide: the suicide does not necessarily kill herself because she wants, say, to make her family unhappy; instead, she may kill herself simply because she is depressed that her life is not going as well as others’ lives (166-68).

“Social Dimensions of Kant’s Conception of Radical Evil” contains Jeanine M. Grenberg’s critical response to Wood’s interpretation. First, Grenberg argues that Wood’s account, in holding that the propensity to evil can emerge only in social conditions, forces Wood into the position that society is causally responsible for everyone’s having a propensity to evil, which would exculpate individuals for their propensities to evil. Wood is aware of this objection, and holds that while being socially situated is a necessary condition for the development of a propensity to evil in an individual, it is not sufficient; whether an individual acts on her propensity to evil is her responsibility (168-70).

Grenberg knows Wood’s response, but she notes that the passage Wood relies on to support his interpretation of the genesis of the propensity to evil holds that “so far as [the human being] exists in isolation … His needs are but limited, and his state of mind in providing for them moderate and tranquil” (6:93).10 Thus, on Wood’s view it seems that in a pre-social state no one is evil, but when you put people into a social setting, they will “mutually corrupt each other’s moral disposition and make one another evil” (6:94) (174-77).11

Grenberg indeed raises an important objection here, but if she is right, it seems to force not only Wood to admit that society makes us evil, but also Kant. So how can Kant hold both that people are responsible for their own propensities to evil while also holding that people are tranquil outside of social settings but corrupt in them?

Grenberg’s solution to this problem is ingenious: she notes that the paragraph wherein these remarks occur is prefaced by the conditional statement that if an agent tries to figure out why he is so tempted to act immorally, “he can easily convince himself” that this is because of “the human beings to whom he stands in relation or association” (6:93).12 In other words, it is not Kant‘s view that people are tranquil outside of society but corrupted once in it; it is rather “the conclusion of the self-deceived ramblings and wishful thinking of an already radically evil Rousseauian!” (178)

The other feature of Wood’s interpretation Grenberg finds problematic is how he thinks Kant understands the propensity. According to Grenberg, Wood holds that the propensity to evil is the propensity to prefer the concerns of self over the concerns of others. However, Grenberg thinks that the proper way to understand the propensity to evil is as the propensity to prefer the concerns of self over the concerns of morality (178).

One problem with this criticism is that Wood, as I noted above, denies that he reduces the propensity to evil as merely a propensity to prefer one’s own concerns over others’ concerns. Instead, it is a propensity to value oneself according to one’s own material condition rather than according to the worth of one’s own person. Even this definition, though, may not allow for certain kinds of evil, for Kant believes that the worth of one’s own condition can be understood only by how it compares to the condition of others.13

Regardless of the status of Wood’s view, Grenberg devotes the rest of her essay to showing how we ought to understand the propensity to evil. On her view, the propensity to evil has to be seen as a necessary condition for moral experience of the type we have (if we had no propensity to evil, we would not suffer temptations, nor would we see the commands of the moral law as obligations) (179), and so manifests both in non-social and in social conditions. More precisely, the manifestation of the propensity to evil at the individual level, in or out of society, is the prioritization of the physical self over the moral self (187-89); by contrast, a socially evil act is one that aims to undermine the conditions that make society possible, i.e., shared social purposes (189-94).


I shall offer only very brief summaries of the remaining essays in the book. Philip J. Rossi, S.J., following Susan Neiman,14 argues in “Kant’s ‘Metaphysics of Permanent Rupture’: Radical Evil and the Unity of Reason” that Kant sees evil not only as the main problem in his practical philosophy but also as the main problem in his theoretical philosophy. Gordon E. Michalson, Jr., in “Kant, the Bible, and the Recovery from Radical Evil”, intriguingly, and maybe even correctly, argues that Kant relies on Biblical narrative as a kind of moral schema that allows us to represent otherwise inconceivable moral phenomena, such as the moral revolution a person must undergo to turn from an evil into a good person. Anderson-Gold, in “Kant, Radical Evil, and Crimes against Humanity”, shows that Kant, despite holding that evil consists in the privileging of self-love over morality, can nonetheless account for the motivations that lead to genocide in a plausible and illuminating way. And David Sussman, in a careful, informative, and exegetically masterful essay, explains the problem that “moral reconstruction” — which is when communities try to “reconstitute themselves justly while properly addressing the wrongs suffered by their members [after a period of significant systemic injustice]” (215) — poses for Kant’s political philosophy, and shows how Kant’s religious philosophy, in its doctrine of moral revolution, might offer a workable solution. Sussman falls a little short in showing how Kant’s religious doctrine of moral revolution is to be applied, so I think Michalson’s essay, which explores just this topic, importantly supplements Sussman here.

Kant’s Anatomy of Evil resoundingly succeeds in showing the depth of Kant’s resources for dealing with the problem of moral evil. Anyone with a professional interest in Kant’s practical philosophy should read it. I cannot predict whether it will succeed in its second goal, i.e., to shift contemporary ethicists’ attention from the justification of morality to why people depart from it, but any ethicist with such an interest will find the essays by Frierson, Wood, Grenberg, Anderson-Gold, and Sussman especially useful.

1 Immanuel Kant, Religion and Rational Theology, translated and edited by Allen W. Wood and George Di Giovanni (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), 77.

2 See also Allen Wood’s contribution to this volume, where he writes “Kant’s treatment of evil is designed to make us aware of the continuity between different cases of evil, what cases of evil have in common (however they may differ in degree), and therefore aware of our kinship with other evildoers rather than our distance from them” (157).

3 He alludes to this in a short paragraph on page 50.

4 Religion and Rational Theology, 80.

5 The main point of Louden’s essay is to defend Kant’s theory of evil against four different criticisms, but I have space here to focus only on his response to the last criticism, which is that Kant must offer more than empirical support for his claim that the propensity to evil is found in all human beings.

6 This is not to say that Card, Frierson, or Louden is unaware of the possible distinction, though not everyone accepts that there is in fact a distinction between the two (e.g., Henry Allison).

7 Religion and Rational Theology, 78.

8 If it were analytically true of human beings that they were disposed to subordinate morality to happiness, then such a propensity could not be a propensity to evil but would just be a propensity to favor one’s own happiness (127).

9 Wood explores this in much greater depth in his Kant’s Ethical Thought (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).

10 Religion and Rational Theology, 129.

11 Ibid.

12 Ibid.

13 See Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Ethics, translated by Peter Heath, edited by Peter Heath and J. B. Schneewind (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), 142.

14 See Susan Neiman, Evil in Modern Thought: An Alternative History of Philosophy (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2002).