Kant's Cosmopolitan Theory of Law and Peace

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Otfried Höffe, Kant's Cosmopolitan Theory of Law and Peace, Alexandra Newton (trans.), Cambridge University Press, 2006, 272pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521534089.

Reviewed by James Bohman, St. Louis University


Kant's place in modern philosophy is largely assured by his critical works, which taken together constitute the systematic development of his transcendental philosophy. By contrast, his political writings mostly take the form of essays and often seem unsystematic and best understood in relation to events of his time. While Kant's Perpetual Peace has had enormous influence historically, it is in crucial respects a large departure from his previous views on cosmopolitanism and difficult to square with many of his writings. In this masterful book, Otfried Höffe makes a strong case that Perpetual Peace in fact provides a systematic political philosophy from a cosmopolitan point of view, in which Kant "elevates peace to a fundamental concept of philosophy" (xv). This cosmopolitanism is not only based on a comprehensive conception of law and right, but is also the first cosmopolitan work to take up the great political innovations of the modern era, a republic based upon legally guaranteed human rights (xv). Far from being a proponent of a second best solution to the problem of a global order in the form of a confederation of republican states, Höffe argues that Kant is best thought of as defending "a federal, subsidiary world republic" as the only means to achieving a "lasting" or "perpetual" peace that is truly global, permanent and unconditional.

Given Höffe's goal of showing that Kant's theory of peace can be reconstructed to encompass morality, law and politics, it is not surprising that this book ranges widely and masterfully across Kant's corpus, from issues in moral judgment and legal ethics, to international politics and republican institutions. Kant is systematically a cosmopolitan, "not only in the political, but also in the philosophical sense" (16). The great achievement of the book is its cumulative argument against the predominant liberal and minimalist interpretations of Kant's work. At the same time, I do not think that Höffe's maximalist interpretation of peace guaranteed through a world republic does full justice to the republican elements of Kant's cosmopolitanism, precisely because it is too state-centered in its focus on the "state form" as a necessary condition for cosmopolitan law. At the end of my discussion I offer a non-statist alternative that better and more consistently unites republicanism and cosmopolitanism and is also more politically and institutionally robust than the moral cosmopolitanism of the minimalist interpretation.

The most obvious place to begin any systematic treatment of Kant's cosmopolitanism -- whether robust or minimalist -- is with his moral universalism. It might be thought that moral universalism leads straightaway to a rather thin and abstract cosmopolitan theory, which eliminates any reference to diverse traditions, cultures or communities. But just as Kant calls for an international legal community without demanding the dissolution of individual states, Höffe argues that Kant rejects an "extreme universalism" based on specific and substantive concrete rules, and accepts rather a more "moderate" universalism based on principles that can be applied in heterogeneous contexts and in diverse cultures and traditions (64-65). The payoff of this moderate universalism, Höffe claims, is a theory of political justice that reconciles the demands of morality and law. In a fascinating analysis of key passages of Kant's Metaphysics of Morals, Höffe sees political order as based in a universal "right to right." The turn to cosmopolitanism comes as an answer to the question of whose freedom is important in creating a just legal order. Since the only answer is all persons, "every subject with legal ability must be granted a second-order right, the right to be reckoned with in this legal capacity and to integration in the community of persons living in a legal form" (121). It is thus a right to legal standing, a "right to have rights" in Arendt's terms. Without this status, Kant argues, human beings would be persons without personality, "beings that have only duties and no rights," and thus "slaves or serfs" and dominated by others who have the power to assign those duties (Höffe, quoting Kant, 122). This right to right gives rise to a correlative basic duty of self-respect or honor, to assert oneself as a legal person, or as Kant puts it, "to demand respect" and not to allow oneself to be debased or treated as a mere means; indeed we have a duty to avoid enslavement and reification of our humanity. Kant includes in this duty of self-respect or honor not allowing oneself to be led blindly by the sovereign "into war as he would take them on a hunt," but rather demanding the right to give one's "free assent to each particular declaration of war." It follows from this duty that when we enter into reciprocal interaction with others at a global scale, we must enter into a legal community with them as persons with just this right to right. On the basis of this right of free assent, Kant argues that non-European peoples not only had the right to resist colonization, but they even had the duty to do so.

This treatment of the right to right is fundamentally republican. With the notion of "kingly peoples," or peoples that give themselves a legal order based on equality, Höffe sees Kant as "democratizing the principle of the philosopher-king" (148). This also gives a further republican twist to Kant's version of the contrast between free persons and slaves. A people who submit to reform and to the principles of legal morality deserve the honorific title "kingly," which a people has only if its members treat each other as equals under a just constitution, so that "no one can bind another without being subject to a law by which he in turn can be bound in the same way by the other" (Kant in Höffe, 148). More than simply being subject to the rule of law, citizens of this sort can bind others to the same extent that they are able to be bound by each other, as equal authors and subjects of the laws. In such a republican fashion, equal freedom is realized through two-way normative powers; that is, in a republic, the distribution of rights and duties is such that no one can dominate any other in virtue of the coercive power of law.

The next step in Höffe's reconstruction of Kant's argument is to connect "the right to right" to a "type of justice that no longer defines right, but also legitimates it" (112). As every aspect of human social existence is subjected to the requirements of law, these requirements are based on the fundamental human right to freedom, which, as Kant insists, is "the only innate right belonging to every human being in virtue of their humanity." Höffe argues that Kant is wrong to see this as constituting a single basic human right, but instead constitutes many different rights of coexistence as they are shaped by law, including the right to a legal order itself, the right to property, and the right to a place in the world that one has inhabited, all of which are based on the right to the world held in common by all humanity. Thus, human rights provide the criterion of justice for claims that can be made upon others on the basis of shared freedom, a freedom that is possible only when social existence is based on nondomination. Even if the rights to freedom are innate and original, they are only guaranteed in the proper legal and political institutionalization of public law and mutual freedom.

With this account of right in mind, the next step in reconstructing Kant's systematic argument should be clear: that a truly global peace is tied to a comprehensive theory of global public right, which includes relations of individuals and groups, the right of nations and the relations among states, and cosmopolitan right. Cosmopolitan right, narrowly construed, concerns the relations of states to individuals and shapes interactions across borders, and includes the right of interaction, whether in communication or trade. But the primary task of cosmopolitan right, broadly construed, includes the obligation to institutionalize a legal-political order for peaceful coexistence, as required by the right to right; that is, by the innate human right to freedom. A cosmopolitan order is politically just to the extent that it also institutionalizes the legal status necessary for nondomination. In Perpetual Peace, the means to achieve this institutionalization do not seem to be the establishment of a world republic, since a truly peaceful order would not be a universal monarchy in which all states are united together as a single state; instead, it seems that an ever expanding federation of peoples achieves a peace that is consistent with fundamental human freedom. Against Kant's explicit claims, Höffe rejects the sufficiency of such a federation of peoples to institutionalize the right to right and peace through public law. In any case, the appeal that such a federation holds for Kant makes clear that he endorses "a complementary rather than an exclusive cosmopolitanism" and that a just cosmopolitan order "does not supplant national civil law, but supplements it" (140). However, this complementarity puts Kantian cosmopolitanism right back on the horns of an institutional dilemma it is supposed to avoid. Either an ever expanding federation is the way to reconcile both political orders, and no public law is established; or a world state is instituted, but law is not realized on the basis of the right to freedom.

Those who accept the first horn of the dilemma often do so for practical reasons. While a world republic is still thought to be the ideal, a federation is simply the only feasible form of cosmopolitanism. Höffe argues that the normative weaknesses of this second-best proposal can be seen by the limitations of the democratic peace hypothesis. The problem with this hypothesis is that the boundaries between the zone of peace and those outside of it show that even an expanding federation cannot establish a comprehensive and lasting peace, precisely because an expanding federation is never truly global. Europeans have often seen the zone of peace as consisting of "civilized peoples," and thus have denied the republican requirement of global legal equality (202). Unless we accept these boundaries as inherently justified, a world republic is the only normatively acceptable alternative. Those who accept the second horn of the dilemma have to show that an appropriately republican world state is not a "soulless despotism" and empire. On democratic grounds, Seyla Benhabib, Jürgen Habermas and others support Kant's federation on the basis of a common eighteenth-century assumption that limitations of size simply rule out the application of democratic and republican ideas of law beyond the state. The citizens of a world state could never constitute themselves as a people who are both the authors and subjects of the laws.

It is clear that Höffe, by contrast, embraces the second horn of the dilemma. He disarms objections to the world republic by showing that there is a necessary connection between such a "minimal world state" and the achievement on nontyranny and nondomination. First, a legal order of a world republic, however complementary and subsidiary, must have "a state form." Because such freedom is achieved through law and legal status, a world republic must have some minimal properties of a state. Second, a comprehensive peace requires that public law can be extended globally, guaranteeing minimal legal equality sufficient for nondomination and replacing the use of force with universal law. In this way, Höffe argues that the only way out of the institutional dilemma is for republics themselves to be bound together in a minimal state form and create a global civil condition that replaces the residual state of anarchy among states even united in a federation (193). His protestation to the contrary, Kant must then accept some analogy between a cosmopolitan legal order and the legal order of a state. Indeed, Kant seems to go a step in this direction when he urges that a federation of peoples should have "a constitution similar to a civil constitution." But even so, Höffe insists that such a federation still "lacks a state form," and that the analogy between individuals forming a state and states forming a world republic is the wrong way to extend the duty to create a legal order. In contrast then to the "primary states," the secondary state or world republic "is assigned only a narrow range of powers; it is then a minimal world state" organized on republican lines. Such a world republic "demands ceding state sovereignty, but only to a minimal extent" (203). Thus, "the public safeguarding of rights in the legal form" culminates in the task of creating a subsidiary and federal world republic (195). This world republic seems in the end to be cosmopolitan in only a very weak sense.

Höffe's argument is successful in overcoming the suggestion that a world state must be despotic. However, its success depends on the assumption that domination is tied exclusively to the absence of a comprehensive, public legal order. However, since states no longer have a monopoly on political violence and domination, and since various formal international organizations such as the World Trade Organization are able to exercise coercive political power as the unchecked agents of states, this assumption no longer holds. Once sovereignty is pooled, there are good republican reasons to reject a function-specific separation of powers as the best way of safeguarding rights. Rather than a strict separation of powers, what is needed for just transnational republican institutions is something quite different from the state form: differentiated, yet overlapping powers. These institutional requirements are reflected in the European Union, which explicitly eschews adopting the state form and multiply realizes human rights in a variety of institutions at different levels.

What is more, Höffe proposal of the role of a world republic is insufficiently republican in motivation. Once again, it might be objected that particular, bounded democratic communities are sufficient to realize human rights so long as they either incorporate the perspective of humanity in their deliberative practices or basic human rights into their constitutions. In order to justify the obligation to establish a world republic of humanity over and above these particular democratic and constitutional states, the general institutional requirements for nondomination need to be much more explicit, in particular as found in the republican analogy between justifications for federations and for transnational institutions. One of the great benefits of federal arrangements is that they are based upon an anti-domination principle that Pettit calls the "dispersion of power condition," the purpose of which is to counteract the tendency toward the centralization and localization typical of state power that plague even democratic states. The need to disperse political power rather than to consolidate it for the sake of enforcement puts the achievement of peace in a new light: it is now easier to see why the security policies of states can undermine liberty at home as well as abroad, a common Enlightenment republican critique of colonialism and empire. Despite all the current changes in the relationships between sovereignty and domination, Kant's core insight remains: that a peace based on common liberty cannot be achieved in individual democratic states alone, but requires a democratic cosmopolitan order based on human rights.  Incorporating the perspective of humanity requires participation in fully cosmopolitan institutions. The strongest argument, then, for why democratic republics must establish a cosmopolitan order is that a lasting peace is possible in an age of global interaction only on the basis of freedom that is shared by all in a cosmopolitan political order that empowers the capacity of everyone to demand respect.