Kant's Critique of Aesthetic Judgment

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Fiona Hughes, Kant's Critique of Aesthetic Judgment, Continuum, 2010, 196pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826497680.

Reviewed by Timothy Sean Quinn, Xavier University (Cincinnati)



Kant’s Critique of Judgment is arguably the towering achievement of the German Enlightenment. Goethe claimed it was the first work of philosophy ever to move him; Fichte deemed it “the crown of the critical philosophy.” In Continuum Press’s most recent addition to its series of introductions to classic works in the history of philosophy, Fiona Hughes has undertaken to explain Kant’s account of aesthetic judgment, the larger portion of the Critique of Judgment. As Hughes puts it in her acknowledgments (viii), the book represents the fruit of years of teaching both in philosophy and in art history. Indeed, the demands her pedagogy has encouraged have resulted in an admirably lucid and fluent commentary.

Hughes divides her book into 4 chapters. The first chapter, “Context,” swiftly establishes an historical, philosophical, and political context for Kant’s critique of aesthetic judgment, situating it both within his critical oeuvre and within the turn to “systematic aesthetics” during the eighteenth century, mentioning Baumgarten, Shaftesbury, and Winckelman in particular. She indicates as well the political context for the third Critique — the continual dangers of censorship even in Friedrich Wilhelm’s relatively enlightened regime, the ideological encroachment of the French revolution intensifying these dangers — and the “wider cultural environment” in which Kant wrote, by which she intends Kant’s oft-noted eremetical existence in Königsberg.

Her second chapter, “Overview of Themes,” enlarges upon the role played by Kantian aesthetics within the critical system. Drawing upon Kant’s own remarks in his “Second Preface” and “Introduction,” Hughes rightly emphasizes the privileged role Kant’s aesthetics plays, harmonizing the mechanical determinism of the natural world with the demands of moral freedom, thereby unifying Kant’s thought. In fact, Hughes reminds the reader of this role frequently throughout the book, in order to focus the reader on the crucial nesting of issues — knowledge, morality, and community, along with matters of the beautiful and art — at stake in Kant’s critique.

Hughes’ third chapter, “Reading the Text,” the lion’s share of the book, is a running commentary on the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment,” the first and lengthier portion of the third Critique. She begins this account again with a review of Kant’s “Preface” and “Introduction,” restricting her attention to those themes most significant for Kant’s aesthetics: the systematic location of aesthetic judgment between nature and freedom and the problem of purposiveness. She then proceeds to address the third Critique section by section, clarifying the conceptual intricacies of Kant’s thought and prose. Her explication of the text emphasizes, among other things, the unity of Kant’s thought, especially in the first four “moments” of his analysis. Indeed, her commentary is valuable for countering the view of the third Critique as a patchwork affair, lacking an overarching principle of unity.

She achieves this sense of the unity of Kant’s argument in part by her discovery of what she names “the idea of dual harmony.” This notion arises as Hughes’ solution to one of the thornier dilemmas in Kantian aesthetics: whether, given Kant’s emphasis on the disinterestedness and “purity” of aesthetic judgment, aesthetic pleasure is merely a “state of mind” (as Kant states) or indeed involves the object provoking that pleasure in any significant way? In brief, because Hughes understands the inaugural four “moments” of the third Critique to offer a “phenomenology of taste,” she renders the relationship between mind and object in aesthetic experience along the lines of a Husserlian “bracketing,” wherein taste’s subjectivity and disinterestedness establish a “contemplative attention” to the manner in which an object presents itself (in keeping with this broadly phenomenological point of view, Hughes relies upon Werner Pluhar’s phenomenologically tinged English translation of the third Critique, and especially his rendering of Kant’s term Vorstellung as “presentation” rather than the more traditional “representation”). Consequently, Hughes identifies aesthetic pleasure as a dual harmony: of the cognitive faculties, understanding and imagination, with one another, and of the mind with the object. Hughes admits that Kant himself did not hold such a view — that "he does not investigate the combination of evaluative and descriptive elements within the phenomenology of taste " — but that her “sketch” is a “natural extension of his account” (38).

Hughes’ interpretation of a dual harmony is indeed central to her commentary, since it ultimately establishes the basis for resolving the central problem of Kantian aesthetics (of which she reminds her reader throughout the book): reconciling nature and freedom, the demands of cognition with the power to assert our moral purposes in the world. It does so, by attempting to explain how the human mind can be at once in the world but not of it. The dual harmony thesis also helps explain why Kant eventually turns to notions of community and “enlargement” of the “common human understanding” as a way of clarifying the sort of consciousness that is properly speaking aesthetic. Finally, it plays a central role in her final chapter, “Reception and Influence,” where Hughes focuses on how the idea of dual harmony is at work in Schiller, Fichte, Schelling, Hegel, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Husserl, Heidegger, Arendt, and finally Merleau-Ponty. The book concludes, fittingly, with a few remarks about the continued relevance of Kant’s aesthetic thought.

Overall, Hughes’ book provides an excellent introduction to Kant’s aesthetics. To say that, however, is not to suggest that the book is in any way facile. She writes about some of Kant’s most fraught notions with great clarity. As befits the introductory intentions of this book, she indicates without strenuously engaging areas of controversy in the secondary literature, for example, the aforementioned question concerning mind’s relation to objects, Kant’s notion of a “common sense” for the beautiful, or of the “universal validity” of aesthetic pleasure. Too, her commentary stresses the unity of Kant’s thought throughout the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment.” She is therefore able to explain the role played by Kant’s account of the sublime, an account some commentators dismiss as tangential or even irrelevant to the main lines of argument in the third Critique, but which Hughes draws into Kant’s larger intentions, showing mind’s relation to nature and to freedom. Although she disparages Kant’s account of the fine arts — she deems it “seriously underdeveloped” (115) — she still manages to explain its role in preparing for Kant’s summary judgment about the beautiful, that it is the “symbol for morality.” Her careful reading of Kant’s text allows her to avoid one stock misrepresentation of Kant’s argument, that is, the temptation to identify what Kant calls “adherent” or “dependant” beauty with artistic beauty, as do many commentators, even though Kant’s examples do not warrant this conclusion. Finally, Hughes’ commentary is alive to the full scope of Kant’s argument. She shows deftly how Kant indicates not only the epistemological, but also especially the moral and political implications of his argument. That is to say, for Hughes, Kant’s aesthetics is not narrow or “mere”; it is a way of orienting us in the world.

In short, even though Hughes periodically indicates areas of ambiguity or insufficiency in Kant’s argument, her Kant is a sympathetic one, and her rendering of Kant’s aesthetics plausible and convincing. At times, however, it seems too sympathetic. While emphasizing Kant’s notions of harmony and “mental attunement,” she is perhaps too sanguine about the latent power of Kant’s notions of the beautiful and artistic form to alienate us from the very world to which it attempts to attune us — one thinks, for example, of the destruction of “traditional” notions of objectivity and completion in painting, or of the increasing emphasis on creative process over the artwork itself, or of the continual fulgurations of artistic self-understanding that accompany the progress of artistic expression in the twentieth century. All of these can be traced to Kant’s aesthetics, even if they do not accord directly with Kant’s own intentions.

The heart of her more sympathetic Kant is her “dual harmony” thesis. This thesis, however useful for rendering Kant’s account of aesthetic experience plausible, is not self-evident, especially given Hughes’ own admission that it is, so to speak, “Kantian” but not Kant’s. In this respect, she could be criticized for importing too “Husserlian” or phenomenological a frame for viewing Kant. The limitations of this frame, however, emerge less in her commentary on Kant’s aesthetics than in her general view of the intentions of the Enlightenment — to establish a rational basis for human experience — and in her concluding historical sketch, which culminates in Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of Perception.

Regarding the Enlightenment project, one could argue that it turned on moral-political issues of human mastery over nature, to which epistemological matters concerning human experience were instrumental. In this light, Kant’s aesthetics would have to be connected to his remarks in the appendix to the third Critique, concerning human being as Endzweck of creation by virtue of being legislator for the whole of creation. Kant’s aesthetics, but especially his account of art, prepare for this conclusion — a point easily overlooked. Perhaps if Hughes had treated the entirety of the third Critique, and not just the critique of aesthetic judgment, she would have been able to advance a more complete view of Kant’s intentions: however privileged the role played by aesthetic judgment, it is still propaedeutic to the teleological issues in the final third of the book, and therefore intimately linked to them.

Regarding the historical sketch, the remarks in her concluding chapter focus on the fate of the dual harmony thesis in subsequent nineteenth and early twentieth century philosophy. However true it may be that this issue plays a significant role in the development of philosophy post-Kant, focus on the harmony issue tends to occlude other, perhaps more salient issues outside the pale of epistemology. The line from Kant to Merleau-Ponty is hardly straight; and even when the goal is to use the latter to rehabilitate the former’s notion of embodiment (133-4), it misrepresents Kant’s intentions somewhat to suggest that the sensus plenior of his aesthetics resides in the phenomenological movement. In Hughes’ defense, her inclusion of a sketch of a post-Kantian history of philosophy could be beneficial for students looking for other avenues to explore. At the very least, it indicates the profound influence the third Critique had on subsequent philosophical as well as aesthetic thought.

A final criticism of the book concerns her addition of “study questions” at the end of several sections of her commentary. For this reader, these questions seemed unnecessary, especially given the clarity of her commentary. All these criticisms, however, are small quibbles. Hughes’ book is a fine work, genuinely useful, and one that I would not hesitate to recommend to my students to help them through the perils of Kant’s text. It displays, among other things, the great value in treating Kant’s aesthetics as a whole, rather than a collection of problems needing solutions. If her Kant is a sympathetic one, it is so for a very good reason: her commentary returns us to the masterwork that is the third Critique with pleasure, with wonder, and with understanding. That is perhaps the finest service any commentary can perform.