Kant's Critique of Practical Reason: A Critical Guide

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Andrews Reath and Jens Timmermann (eds.), Kant's Critique of Practical Reason: A Critical Guide, Cambridge UP, 2010, 238pp. $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521896856.

Reviewed by Brian Watkins, Duke University


This new collection of essays in Cambridge's Critical Guides series consists of first-rate commentaries by an international group of scholars on various aspects of Kant's Critique of Practical Reason. Overall, the essays provide careful readings of Kant's text, draw on his other writings for context where appropriate, and analyze his claims and arguments with clarity and philosophical acumen. As the subtitle indicates, these essays are intended to provide a 'critical guide' to Kant's second Critique. Such a label brings with it a variety of possible expectations, and I will consider which of these the collection seems best able to meet.

One might expect that a critical guide to the second Critique would make it a point to treat all major aspects of the work, and this collection nearly does so. The essays cover the following topics: Kant's reasons for writing a second Critique, how best to understand the notion of a 'formal principle,' the significance of the fact of reason, the development of Kant's deductions of morality and freedom from the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals to the second Critique, the doctrine of the Triebfeder or 'spring' of pure practical reason, Kant's discussion of freedom and how to reconcile it with causal determinism, the Antinomy of Pure Practical Reason and Kant's notion of the highest good, the primacy of practical reason and the notion of a postulate in general, and, finally, the importance and meaning of the Doctrine of Method. One major omission is a detailed discussion of the postulates, that is, Kant's arguments (from a practical perspective) for the existence of God and the immortality of the soul. Marcus Willaschek provides an excellent discussion of the notion of a postulate in general, drawing on remarks from the first Critique to specify its epistemic status and the sense in which it can legitimately extend cognition, if only in a 'practical' sense. In addition, he reconstructs and evaluates Kant's argument for the primacy of practical over theoretical reason, which provides a general argument for belief in postulates independently of their content. But, unfortunately, there is no discussion of the specific postulates Kant describes or his claim that it is necessary to take them to be true in order to will the highest good. So, while Willaschek's essay is quite helpful, the collection overall might leave some readers wanting just a bit more.

Since this collection is a critical guide to the second Critique, one might expect to come away from these essays with a sense for the various debates surrounding Kant's text. The essays vary to the extent that they explicitly describe the critical landscape. Pauline Kleingeld's essay on what Kant means by calling the 'fact of reason' a fact provides a clear overview of the major interpretive positions taken by commentators on this issue. She argues in favor of a reading that synthesizes and builds upon some of these approaches, and uses it to explain how Kant might respond to common misunderstandings of his position. The other essays tend not to situate their claims directly with respect to existing critical debates. While all of the essays address secondary sources where appropriate, none seem intended to provide a review of the recent literature.

Instead, this collection is best understood as a critical guide to the Critique of Practical Reason simply in the sense that each essay proposes to lead the reader toward a better understanding of some problematic aspect of this text. For example, Stefano Bacin explains how the Doctrine of Method fits within and contributes crucially to the general project of the Critique of Practical Reason. Pierre Keller discusses Kant's distinction between 'psychological' and 'transcendental' freedom, evaluates his reasons as to why only the latter can be reconciled with the causal determinism of the phenomenal world, and explains what Kant might mean by the 'noumenal' character that belongs to persons insofar as they are free. Andrews Reath unpacks Kant's claim that a practical law must be a formal principle, that is, one that determines the will through its form rather than its matter, and applies his reading to reconstruct and clarify arguments in the early part of the Analytic. Some essays draw on Kant's other writings to provide a useful context for interpretation. Heiner Klemme examines a variety of letters and other texts to discuss why Kant, after completing the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, felt the need to write a second Critique. Jens Timmermann, in order to clarify Kant's position on the possibility and need for a deduction of morality, discusses the extent to which Kant retreats in the second Critique from certain claims regarding this issue made in the Groundwork. Eric Watkins draws upon Kant's discussion of the Antinomies from the first Critique to reconstruct Kant's argument for the Antinomy of Pure Practical Reason found in the second.

Although the focus on explaining Kant's text might seem to indicate that the essays are aimed at beginning students of the second Critique, this is not always the case. The best essays in this collection manage to provide enough discussion of the text so as not to be inaccessible to those who are less familiar with it, while also evaluating its claims in a way that should be interesting even to those already well-acquainted with Kant's moral theory. Like good travel writing, these essays make you want to visit the second Critique -- that is, to think about it for yourself -- even if you have explored it before. The commentators accomplish this by interpreting and evaluating Kant's text in distinctive and philosophically compelling ways. For example, in addition to reconstructing the argument for the Antinomy of Pure Practical Reason, Watkins explores several issues connected with Kant's notion of the highest good: why there must be an object of pure practical reason at all, why there must be one such object, why and in what sense it must be the highest good, and why this must involve virtue and happiness in connection with each other. Willaschek, in his discussion of Kant's notion of a postulate in general, argues that this kind of belief, that is, one that is rational to hold even without any (theoretical) evidence, may be more common than Kant acknowledges.

Let me take a moment to discuss one essay that I find particularly interesting. Stephen Engstrom discusses Kant's doctrine of the Triebfeder of morality, that is, the 'spring' -- as Engstrom translates the term -- of pure practical reason. This doctrine is meant to explain how pure reason of itself exerts an influence over one's sensible nature in such a way that it makes one's will more susceptible to being determined by the moral law. Kant argues that consciousness of the moral law strikes down self-conceit, that is, one's natural propensity to make the satisfaction of one's own inclinations the sole determining basis of one's will. This leads to a feeling of humiliation and, in turn, a feeling of respect through which pure reason finally begins to gain influence over one's sensible nature. Engstrom provides an excellent discussion of Kant's explanation for the feeling of respect, including a detailed analysis of self-conceit and the related notion of self-love. He argues that self-conceit involves seeing oneself as the sole authority for what ought to be done, one whose demands ought to be regarded by everyone as valid. This self-conception is undermined whenever one recognizes that the moral law is, in fact, the only basis for determining the will that has universal validity. It is humiliating, Engstrom argues, to acknowledge that the normative scope of one's own 'law,' valid only for oneself, is vanishingly small in comparison with that of pure reason, which extends to all rational beings. This humiliation turns to respect when we recognize that the moral law is not some outside force, but a demand we make of ourselves (pp. 114-117).

This is an intriguing proposal, but it seems that, when we become conscious of the moral law, it is not just its universal validity that strikes down our self-conceit and humiliates us. After all, one who is self-conceited could look down on what is valid for everyone, holding himself to his own standard, one that he takes to be higher, more distinguishing, and nobler than that which the common person finds worthy of respect. An alternative reading might locate the ground of humiliation in the moral law's unconditional authority. In various examples throughout the second Critique and in his discussion of the dynamical sublime in the third Critique, Kant reminds us that we can do whatever reason demands no matter what our concerns as a sensible being may be. Indeed, the experience of the sublime is just the recognition that nothing sensible can even serve as a measure for the authority with which reason commands. Insofar as we recognize that absolutely nothing can stand up to, much less override, the authority of the moral law, self-conceit's pretension to make the maximal satisfaction of our inclinations the sole end of all action is thwarted and, as a result, we feel humiliated. We may, of course, find that we are not, in fact, virtuous enough to follow the moral law. In becoming conscious of pure reason's demand, I recognize merely that I can treat all of my inclinations as small in comparison, but this is enough to block self-conceit's attempt to make these inclinations the sole determining ground of my will. So, what is truly humiliating, I take it, is not, or not only, the extent to which the moral law is valid but the fact that reason alone commands with an authority that is absolute.

I bring up this example because I take it to be representative of how these essays strive to serve as a critical guide to the second Critique. Even if one might find ways to supplement Engstrom's reading, his guide to this section of the text is provocative and illuminating. The other essays are as well. They are not bland, uncontroversial summaries of Kant's text, but commentaries in the best sense: they offer thoughtful close readings that stimulate further dialogue. As such, these essays serve as a guide in one other sense too: they show how good work in the history of philosophy ought to be done.