Kant's Critique of Spinoza

Placeholder book cover

Omri Boehm, Kant's Critique of Spinoza, Oxford University Press, 2014, xxxiv + 252pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199354801.

Reviewed by G. Anthony Bruno, University of Bonn


We are accustomed to thinking that the pre-critical Kant, among the rationalist positions, is closest to Leibniz and, amid various problems, responds chiefly to Hume. Kant claims as much in the Prolegomena after singling out Leibniz's metaphysics: "the remembrance of David Hume was the very thing that many years ago first interrupted my dogmatic slumber" (AA 4:257, 260). Yet in a 1798 letter to Garve, he says what first shakes his slumber is the need to resolve "the antinomy of pure reason", specifying the first antinomy regarding the world's beginning and the third antinomy regarding freedom (AA 12:257-8). These antinomies don't signify a Humean threat. In this book, Omri Boehm rigorously and engagingly argues that they indeed represent a Spinozistic threat.

Boehm interprets the antinomies in the Critique of Pure Reason as evidence that Kant aims exclusively to refute Spinoza, so that the critique of reason just is a critique of Spinozism (pp. xviii, xxiii). His interpretive claim therefore challenges the customary thought of what woke Kant. More controversially, Boehm reconstructs The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (hereafter Beweisgrund) as knowingly if silently committed to substance monism, so that Kant's subsequent critique targets his own former Spinozism and that, moreover, the doctrine of the thinkable but unknowable transcendental ideal represents an epistemically muzzled or "regulative Spinozism" (p. 7). His reconstructive claim thus challenges the customary thought of what Kant dreamt. Finally and most controversially, Boehm claims that Kant's solution to the antinomies cannot show that existence isn't a predicate without begging the question against Spinoza, but must show that the principle of sufficient reason (PSR) depends on the assumption of contingency -- that the idea that everything happens for a reason depends on the idea that everything could have been otherwise. Indeed, Boehm argues that the dependency claim is required by our moral conviction that the world isn't as it ought to be. With the customary thought contested, his dependency claim boldly restricts the PSR while lending plausibility to Kant's critical project.

I will treat Boehm's reconstructive, interpretive and dependency claims in turn. Chapter 1 offers the reconstructive claim that Kant evolves from silent to regulative Spinozist. While it gives a persuasive Spinozistic reading of the proof of God's existence in the Beweisgrund, I suggest the doctrine of the transcendental ideal doesn't constitute an epistemically muzzled Spinozism. Chapters 2 and 3 make the interpretive claim that Kant's indirect proof of transcendental idealism in the antinomies targets Spinozism. This removes scholarly confusion over the proponents of the antinomies' theses and antitheses, but raises the question of its compatibility with Kant's direct proof in the Transcendental Aesthetic, which doesn't target Spinoza. Chapter 4 contains the dependency claim that Kant's advantage over Spinozism lies in showing that the PSR assumes contingency. It invites us to evaluate our own commitment to the PSR and morality, but also demands revisiting the claim motivating the customary thought about Kant's turn, for Kant might respond as much to Hume as to Spinoza. If this poses a problem for Boehm's argument, it doesn't weaken his valuable thought that our commitment to reason has its limits -- even that we limit knowledge to make room for moral faith.

In the Critique of Practical Reason and Lectures on Metaphysics, Kant says denying the transcendental ideality of space and time entails Spinozism. One is therefore struck by Boehm's claim that the Beweisgrund, although pre-critical, is knowingly Spinozist. He reconstructs from the text a seven-step argument for substance monism (pp. 20-28):

(1) Something's essence depends on formal and material possibility.
(2) Formal possibility depends on material possibility.
(3) Material possibility is grounded in something actually existing.
(4) Necessarily something is possible.
(5) Necessarily something exists.
(6) There is a being that exists necessarily.
(7) There is only one necessary being.

'Formal possibility' denotes the logical relations among something's predicates, while 'material possibility' denotes the set of its predicates (1); but logical relations themselves depend on their relata (2). Thus, the idea of a right triangle depends on the logical relation between 'is three-sided' and 'has a 90-degree angle', which itself depends on these predicates. Predicates cannot merely be relata in relations comprising something's essence, Kant argues, for either their analysis arrives "at something whose possibility cannot be analyzed" or they are "empty words" (AA 2:80-1). On pain of the latter, formal and material possibility depend on actuality (3).

Boehm uses the Beweisgrund's reliance on the PSR to provide Kant an explicit argument for (4), offering a reductio: if nothing is possible, nothing is actual; but then there is no (actual) reason that nothing is possible; thus, necessarily something is possible (p. 26). From (3) and (4), (5) follows. Justifying the pivotal step to (6), Boehm provides another explicit argument, stressing Kant's reference to 'all possibility': all possibility must be grounded; only one being grounds all possibility, lest multiple grounds exist and their relations depend on further grounds ad infinitum (p. 28). While Kant doesn't make this argument, Boehm observes its analogy to the Critique's argument that only one subject grounds all representations. (It also parallels the argument that only one unconditioned condition grounds all cognitions (AA A308/B364)). Since (6) rules out two necessary beings, (7) follows. This, Boehm says, "strongly suggests substance monism" (p. 38).

Boehm's lucid account of the Beweisgrund makes it difficult to deny Kant's pre-critical attraction to monism. His account of the transcendental ideal suggests this attraction survives into the critical period. Boehm notes that the first Critique rejects the "only three" (AA A598/B618) proofs of God's existence -- ontological, cosmological, physico-theological -- despite the Beweisgrund's offer of a fourth. Rather than refute the latter proof, he says, Kant "adopts its main argument" while rejecting the "proof-status of the conclusion" (pp. 47-48). The transcendental ideal is defined as the most real being (ens realissimum) grounding the sum-total of reality (omnitudo realitatis). Such a being -- God -- is a whole that precedes its parts as its mere limitations, not a whole subsequent to its parts as their mere aggregate. Contra Henry Allison, Paul Franks and others, Boehm indicates that Kant and Spinoza agree in refusing to identify God with the sum-total of reality: for both, the whole ontologically precedes its parts. Their difference lies in Kant's denial that we can know, rather than think, God's existence. Kant's Spinozism, then, is regulative (p. 49).

Why does Kant turn from silent to regulative Spinozist? Boehm explains that the critical turn prohibits the move to (6) -- the claim that a being exists necessarily that grounds all possibility. This move is the result of transcendental illusion, which confuses (P1) reason's demand for the unconditioned condition of conditioned knowledge with (P2) the claim to know this condition. Boehm reads P1 and P2 as subjective and objective formulations of the PSR: P1 sets the search for the explanatory ground of all things as a regulative task; P2 dogmatically declares this ground's discovery (p. 52). Boehm thereby usefully bridges Kantian interests in the unconditioned with rationalist interests in the PSR.

Granting that Kant is a monist who trades P2 for P1, we might resist portraying his transition as uniformly Spinozistic. In his 1783/4 lectures on theology, he describes the concept of God as "the foundation of transcendental philosophy" and as denoting "the root of everything". This agrees with the doctrine of the transcendental ideal. But Kant also says we cannot leave "undecided" how God is constituted: God must be "a living being . . . having cognition and free will" (AA 9:1000). Not only do attributions of cognition and will contradict Spinoza's conception of God, but Kant's insistence that we think (not know) "a living God, a free being which has given the world its existence . . . out of his own free power of choice" (AA 9:1001) contradicts Spinoza's rejection of teleology. If Kant holds this view just after writing the first Critique, the transcendental ideal may epistemically muzzle a monistic position without that position being Spinozistic. Moreover, the ideal represents a system of cognition, which Kant casts in teleological terms as growing organically, "like an animal body" (AA A833/B861). A philosophy aimed at such a system, he says, is a "teleology of human reason (teleologia rationis humanae)" (AA A839/B867). Boehm plausibly suggests that a Prussian philosophy professor couldn't confess to Spinozism in 1763, before the Pantheismusstreit that thrust Spinozism to the center of late 18th century German philosophy (p. 44). But it's a question whether that professor's persistent monism remained Spinozistic.

Kant never mentions Spinoza in the first Critique. Boehm's interpretive claim that the first Critique exclusively targets Spinozism is thus no small matter. He says "Kant's maneuver in the Antinomies is fully conscious of the realization that transcendental realism is committed to Spinozism" (p. 37), a fact obscured by confusion over the identity of the proponents of the antinomies' theses and antitheses. To show this, Boehm draws on Descartes' indefinite-infinite distinction. The indefinite is a series with a ceaseless potential to increase and so cannot be completed; by contrast, the infinite is the largest possible measure and so complete. Now, the first antinomy's thesis states that the world has a beginning; otherwise an infinite series of events has been completed, which is incoherent. Despite the use of 'infinite', this is to say the world is indefinite. Contra Allison and Sadik Al Azm, Boehm argues that the thesis is Leibnizian, for Leibniz not only affirms the world's creation, in line with the thesis, but adopts Descartes' distinction in the New Essays, reserving infinity for God and affirming the world's indefiniteness (pp. 74-75). By contrast, the first antinomy's antithesis states that the world has no beginning: otherwise it arises from something whose condition is arbitrary. This is to say the world is infinite. But there is "only one relevant rationalist thinker who has a good reason to insist, as does the Antithesis, that the world is positively infinite" (p. 80): Spinoza. Indeed, only Spinoza personifies what Kant calls the antithesis' "pure empiricism", which Boehm interprets as mechanistic naturalism (p. 86). Leibniz, who personifies the thesis, famously revives final causation.

Boehm says the first and third antinomies are "systematically related" (p. 110). Plausibly, if one holds the first thesis (the world is spontaneously created), one holds the third (freedom exists); and if one holds the first antithesis (the world is infinite), one holds the third (freedom doesn't exist). But if these Leibnizian and Spinozistic positions constitute the antinomies, how is Spinoza Kant's sole target? To prove this, Boehm cites the second Critique: "Spinozism . . . argues more consistently than the creation theory can when beings assumed to be substances and in themselves existing in time [and space] are regarded as effects of a supreme cause and yet as not belonging to him and his action" (AA 5:102). This passage expresses Kant's belief that Leibniz inconsistently ascribes space and time to things-in-themselves while denying them to God. Hence his claim that Leibnizians show "more shrewdness than sincerity in keeping [Spinozism] out of sight as much as possible" (AA 5:103). But if Leibniz's position is a false alternative to Spinoza's, Kant's transcendental realist rival is exclusively Spinozistic. Hence Kant's claim that, unless transcendental idealism is adopted, "nothing remains but Spinozism" (AA 5:102).

More troubling is the possibility that Spinoza can resolve the antinomies and refute transcendental idealism. Drawing on Kant's distinction between an analytic whole (totum analyticum), which precedes its parts, and a synthetic whole (totum syntheticum), whose parts precede it, Boehm argues that the Leibnizian thesis leaves the Spinozistic antithesis untouched. The thesis assumes the world is a synthetic whole, the enumeration of whose parts proceeds ad infinitum, from which it follows that the series of events cannot be infinite and complete. But the antithesis assumes the world is an analytic whole whose parts cannot be independently conceived. If the antithesis escapes the thesis, Boehm says, it may be immune to the antinomies (p. 93).

Boehm takes Kant at his word that transcendental idealism's only consistent rival is Spinozism, clarifying the stakes by showing that transcendental idealism's indirect proof in the antinomies must reject Spinoza's idea of a cosmological analytic whole. But what of the direct proof in the Transcendental Aesthetic, which demonstrates the ideality of space and time, apparently refuting transcendental realism? Doesn't this already domesticate Spinoza's idea, effectively propounding a spatio-temporal analytic whole and assigning it to human sensibility? Moreover, while the indirect proof targets pure empiricism, the direct proof targets pure rationalism, which derives space and time from logic, and crude empiricism, which derives them from experience. If so, Boehm's interpretive claim might be qualified: the critique of reason is chiefly, but not exclusively, a critique of Spinoza. This nevertheless intriguingly suggests Kant's solution to the antinomies is motivated by Spinozism and thus responds to nihilism avant la lettre.

Boehm's dependency claim marks the book's deepest contribution, for it suggests that our commitment to reason and morality entails a sharp limit on the PSR and that this finds an ally in Kant, who limits reason to make room for moral faith. The dependency claim holds that Kant must invert Spinoza's reduction of practical reason to theoretical cognition of God by indicating how our metaphysical concern for why things are depends on our moral concern for how they ought to be. To show this, Boehm argues that the Spinozist or rationalist only refutes Kant if she can defend the ontological argument, i.e., if she can prove that God's conceivability entails its existence and hence that existence is a predicate.

The rationalist can assume for a reductio that x and the existence of ~x are conceivable. But this is impossible: given the PSR, the existence of neither x nor ~x can involve brute facts and yet, given the assumption, there can be no reason that x exists and ~x does not. Thus, x's conceivability entails its existence. Boehm rejects this argument. While it explains existence and causality in terms of conceivability, it assumes conceivability as a primitive notion. To the question 'why is God conceived as existing', it simply answers: 'because God is what it is'. Boehm's remarkable observation is that if the rationalist simply assumes the ontological argument's validity, not only is God's existence unexplained, but "nothing has been sufficiently accounted for . . . . Everything remains a brute fact". If that which is its own sufficient reason cannot be proven, nothing has a sufficient reason and "the PSR falls apart" (p. 160).

After considering rationalist responses and Kantian rebuttals, Boehm observes that they beg the question against each other: by assuming a merely possible thing that could come into existence, Kant assumes existence isn't a predicate; by assuming the ontological argument's validity, the rationalist assumes existence is a predicate (pp. 169-71). To break the impasse, Boehm claims that our why-questions assume that (1) everything happens for a reason and (2) everything could have been otherwise, and argues that (1) presupposes (2): "It is because we think that things could have occurred otherwise that we think that there has to be a reason why they occurred" (p. 174). If we thought something's existence was necessary -- namely, God's -- we wouldn't ask, with Schelling and Schopenhauer, why there is something rather than nothing. But since do ask this -- when, demanding justice, we ask why the world is as it is -- we cannot think that. It follows that "our motivation to apply the PSR is based on the assumption that there is a distinction between existence and possibility" (p. 175). But then the ontological argument fails and, it would seem, transcendental realism is false.

Boehm's provocative argument is that (1) depends on (2) because we only have a "genuine reason" to ask why-questions if nothing is conceptually necessary (p. 175). If (2) justifies (1), we are barred from the PSR's objective formulation (P2), for we cannot know the unconditioned condition if existence isn't a predicate (p. 180). Hence, we are restricted to P1 and, perhaps, to some variety of transcendental idealism.

Whatever one's views about rationalism, Boehm's dependency claim is certainly morally compelling. I suspect Boehm's main claims must still confront the Prolegomena's report that Hume disrupts Kant's dogmatic slumber. It precedes by only four years the B-edition Critique's emphasis on fatalism and atheism, which Kant deems less "injurious" than skepticism (AA Bxxxiv). The Prolegomena unequivocally asserts that, by endangering all metaphysical concepts, Humean skepticism drives the critique of metaphysics (AA 4:260). Indeed, that text is clear that Humean skepticism threatens the "violence" (AA 4:271) of undermining the unity -- and hence the moral agency -- of the rational subject. We would not be surprised if Kant targets Hume as much as Spinoza, for he holds that empirical idealism and transcendental realism are two sides of one coin (AA A369). Nevertheless, Boehm's original and meticulously argued book enriches Kant scholarship by drawing attention to the question of monism. It moreover challenges a wider philosophical audience by adducing our moral faith as evidence of the bounds of reason.