Kant's Defense of Common Moral Experience: A Phenomenological Account

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Jeanine Grenberg, Kant's Defense of Common Moral Experience: A Phenomenological Account, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 300pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107033580.

Reviewed by Patrick Frierson, Whitman College


Through close readings of key passages from the Groundwork and Critique of Practical Reason,[1] Jeanine Grenberg restores an emphasis on what she calls "phenomenological" attention to "common moral experience" as the "proper source for practical philosophical cognition" (288). She starts in chapters 1-3 with a general exposition of her interpretive framework, then (chs. 4-5) offers a new interpretation of the failure of Kant's argument for moral obligation in Groundwork III, and finally (chs. 6-11) lays out her positive account of Kant's moral theory, drawn mostly from the Critique of Practical Reason. The book has shortcomings, but its main point -- the emphasis on carefully attending to what is already present in common moral life -- is a refreshing break from highly technical readings of Kant, whether overly meta-ethical or focused on highly specific maxim-splicing. She reminds us that we, like Kant, must let our "blinding prejudice vanish [and] learn to honor [ordinary] human beings" (20:44). And her specific conception of phenomenology, while not as developed as it might be, reveals an important and underappreciated feature of (Kant's analysis of) moral life.

The book's main character is the "Gallows Man" (GM) familiar to readers of Kant's Critique of Practical Reason (5:29-30); Grenberg reads GM as coming to recognize the authority of the moral law (and the fact of his freedom) from attentive reflection on his felt experience of conflict between duty and inclination. GM first "asserts of his [presumedly immoral] lustful inclination that . . . it is quite irresistible" but is then faced with two hypothetical scenarios, the first where "a gallows [would be] erected . . . and he would be hanged on it immediately after gratifying his lust" and the second where "his prince demanded, on pain of the same immediate execution, that he give false testimony against an honorable man" (5:30, quoted on 163). From the first imagined scenario, GM realizes that he is capable of overcoming his strongest particular inclinations for the sake of love of life. From the second, he learns that he can overcome even love of life for the sake of doing what he ought.

Grenberg beautifully shows how GM's experiences are extreme cases of "common" experiences of "conflict amongst our inclinations" or "conflict between our pursuit of happiness . . . and morality" (164). She then argues that careful attention to these common experiences is sufficient for objective, a priori, practical cognitions of the moral law and positive freedom. Throughout, while remaining faithful to an orthodox Kantian conception of duty (as universal moral law expressible in terms of classic formulations of the categorical imperative), Grenberg constantly emphasizes the commonness of our experience of duty. For example, she regularly translates Kantian lingo into ordinary statements of how obligation feels, cashing out Kant's notion of a categorical imperative as the commonsense "I don't want to do this! But I [have] to" (238) or his doctrine of ought implies can as "I know . . . that I am capable of living up to what I expect of myself" (253). 

Her emphasis on common moral life is a valuable orientation for Kant's moral philosophy, and there is much else to appreciate in the book, but the rest of this review focuses on two central and problematic features: the notion of "phenomenology," which I think needs considerable further clarification, and the role of feeling, about which I have serious reservations.

The book's subtitle is "A Phenomenological Account." One might, in this context, expect some discussion of other "phenomenological" philosophers (Husserl, Merleau-Ponty, etc.), but Grenberg draws almost entirely from Kant[2] to distinguish "phenomenological experience from . . . empirical experience," explaining that the former is "more 'subjective' than 'objective'" and that "in a phenomenological experience, we do not look outside of ourselves [but] . . . focus on the subjective experience of being an agent" (16-17). This basic conception of phenomenology is laid out in chapter one and exemplified throughout the book, but key aspects of it are left implicit or vague. For example, one of phenomenology's features for Grenberg is that it is "first-personal." An emphasis on first-personal reflection is quite standard amongst contemporary neo-Kantians.

Like commentators such as Korsgaard or O'Neill (or indeed myself[3]), Grenberg contrasts the first-personal perspective with a scientific, "spectatorial," third-personal perspective (e.g., 19). But her approach has a quite different flavor, which can be appreciated by comparing an example of her first-personal reflection with, say, one of Christine Korsgaard's. For Grenberg, the following is paradigmatic first-personal, "phenomenological" reflection:

Through his experience of feelings of constraint, the Gallows Man . . . learns that he can and must exclude his concerns of self-love from his appreciation of those things that weigh upon him morally . . . But once one sets such rationalizing tendencies aside, as our Gallows Man has, then the experience of conflict [between morality and self-love] becomes a morally edifying experience: I understand my feelings of gratification and pain as saying something to me morally, namely, that morality infringes upon my would-be satisfaction of my inclinations and that I am in fact categorically obligated to those demands I recognize as authoritative. (173-4)

Korsgaard's approach is equally first-personal, but with a very different focus:

human consciousness has a reflective structure that sets us normative problems. It is because of this that we require reasons for action, a conception of the right and the good. To act from such a conception is in turn to have a practical conception of your identity . . . now that you see that your need to have a normative conception of yourself comes from your human identity, you can query the importance of that identity. . . . But in this case you have no option but to . . . value your humanity if you are to act at all. . . . Therefore we find ourselves to be valuable. Therefore . . . we are valuable. . . . And there's a good reason why the argument must take this form . . . Value, like freedom, is only directly accessible from within the standpoint of reflective consciousness.[4]

Both Grenberg and Korsgaard draw from what Grenberg calls the "common human experience"[5] of being an agent. But there are some fundamental differences in how each conceives of the first-person point of view.

First, Grenberg's GM focuses on his experience as an agent rather than looking at the world from the standpoint of his agency. GM notices that he is conflicted, while Korsgaard's agent pays attention to the conflicting reasons (and underlying identities) themselves. This distinction is tied to a second fundamental difference. In a telling passage, Grenberg sharply distinguishes first-personal reflection from "a . . . spectatorial view of another person's actions, even when such observation is conducted with . . . practical or moral interest" (19). In contrast, for Korsgaard (e.g., Sources 141), we can take a "first person" point of view on others' reasons. In my view, Korsgaard is clearly correct about the possibility of looking at the world from another's first-person perspective, so when Grenberg claims that "I cannot have phenomenological experience of another person's experience" (17), she must be making use of some notion of phenomenology that goes beyond the first-person/third-person distinction. Relatedly, Korsgaard distinguishes, more clearly than Grenberg, between a genuinelyfirst-personal stance on one's choices and actions and a merely introspective stance, wherein one is a spectator of one's own mental states, treating them as internal events susceptible of empirical explanation.

A final distinctive feature of Grenberg's phenomenology is that while Korsgaard's first-person reflection is fundamentally active, Grenberg's phenomenology is an attention[6] to what is passively given, "an activity of being receptive to what is present" (185). For Korsgaard, the necessity of moral obligation is due to the fact that we "have to" value humanity if we act at all, for Grenberg, this necessity is "accessed through . . . a very particular felt experience . . . that will not go away" (218-19, emphasis shifted). For Korsgaard, we must takeourselves to be obligated, while for Grenberg, we find ourselves to be obligated.

We might, then, consider four different perspectives one can take on human actions:

(1) Korsgaard's first-personal practical reflection from the standpoint of a free chooser, from which one attends to salient reasons (rather than mere causes) for action.

(2) Grenberg's "phenomenological" practical standpoint, wherein one attends not to practical reasons themselves, but to ways those reasons show up to one subjectively.

(3) Introspection, when one internally observes various motives, feelings, and other mental states that give rise to one's actions as empirically-available mental events.

(4) Descriptive (external) observation of actions -- whether one's own or another's -- in the world.

Thus in the context of moral obligation, we might distinguish:

(1) taking myself to be morally obligated "as soon as [I] draw up maxims of the will for" myself (5:29)

(2) attending to the feeling (in respect) of the force of moral obligation, particularly in the face of competing inclinations

(3) (introspectively) observing various temporally-situated, conscious states of cognizing and feeling for the moral law

(4) observing actions that seem to conform (or not) to the moral law.

Kantians have long recognized a fundamental distinction between (1) and (4), articulating this in terms of a difference between first- and third-personal points of view. Properly understood, (3) is also a third-person point of view, and thus should be distinguished from anything that could be considered "phenomenology." But Grenberg helpfully draws attention to the possibility of a different, more passive, kind of genuinely first-personal reflection (sense 2). There is a "what-it's-like-to-be-obligated," and Kant is interested in this phenomenology (particularly, in my view, in his discussion of respect in the second Critique 5:72-89). And this might well lead Kantians who follow Grenberg's lead towards a deeper appreciation of and engagement with the phenomenological tradition (particularly starting with Husserl). I'm skeptical about such phenomenological engagement leading to the kinds of substantive moral conclusions for which Grenberg hopes, and I'm skeptical of her readings of particular texts -- including Kant's account of GM -- as being "phenomenological" in this sense. But I'm optimistic that Grenberg's style of Kantian phenomenology can shed light on what it means to be the kinds of "dependent and corrupt but capable and dignified rational agent[s]" that we human beings are.[7] With respect to phenomenology, while Grenberg's book is not as clear as it might be and too quickly rejects Korsgaard-style approaches to the first-person perspective, it opens important vistas for further work.

I'm much less convinced by Grenberg's new account of the role that feeling plays in Kant's moral philosophy. Over the past couple of decades, many have ascribed prominent roles to feeling within Kant's moral philosophy. One important trend (e.g., Sherman 1997; Herman 1997) sees feeling as important for identifying morally salient features of situations in order to correctly apply the moral law. Another important trend emphasizes the feeling of respect as a moral motive, pitting so-called "affectionists" who endorse this role against "intellectualists" who insist that the moral law motivates directly.[8] Grenberg's book is the first to my knowledge to posit an even more fundamental role for moral feeling. On her account, only "moral feeling allows us epistemic access to our rational natures" (69), and since these rational natures "make moral laws binding" (68), "We can . . . assert an objective practical cognition of the validity of the moral law [only] through attentive consideration of our felt experience of the moral feeling of respect" (66). In that sense, feeling gives access to the moral law itself. Against even most affectionists, for example, who see feeling as giving motivational force to an already-given consciousness of the moral law, in Grenberg's model "respect com[es] upon us . . . with no previous consciousness of the moral law informing it" (148). Through attending to the "felt . . . conflict between happiness and morality" (169), one "learns that he is categorically obligated to the moral law and . . . capable of acting as that law demands" (170).

Grenberg's defense of this strong role for feeling is partly textual (she relies especially on Groundwork 4:450-51 and Critique of Practical Reason 5:90-91) and partly philosophical. With respect to her textual support, I can say only that the passages she cites seem to me insufficient support for her strong account of feeling.[9] Philosophically, her primary argument[10] focuses on the fact that because feeling is passive, it is uniquely able to be the vehicle for the "Fact" that we are morally obligated: "Most centrally, . . . Kant presents the Fact of Reason . . . as something that 'forces itself upon us' . . . But a forced fact has to be a felt fact: when we have something forced upon us, we are passive or receptive in relation to [it]" (143). The argument from the "forced" nature of the Fact of Reason, however, begs the question against those like Henry Allison or Korsgaard who think that there are constitutive requirements for activities such as choice or experience. Korsgaard's first-personal reflection on agency arguably shows how a value -- e.g., humanity -- can be "forced" in a necessary activity of valuing rather than as a passively-received feeling. Of course, a full examination of Grenberg's argument would require more than I can provide in this review; by introducing the most ambitious account of the role of feeling in recent Kant literature, she has, at the very least, opened a frontier for further debate.

In the end, Grenberg's book provides a very welcome reminder that for all its formalism and jargon, Kant's moral theory rests on moral common sense. She exemplifies a kind of first-personal attentiveness to the "experience" of agency that is importantly distinct from other neo-Kantian approaches to the first person perspective and worth taking more seriously. And she has launched a bold new thesis about the role of feeling in Kant's moral philosophy.

[1] Grenberg also makes use of one important passage from the Metaphysics of Morals, which defines the nature of feeling (6:211-12, cited on pp. 42-3), but she has no discussion of Kant's unpublished remarks or lectures on metaphysics, anthropology, and ethics, where he discusses feeling (and other topics in the book) in detail. One of many unfortunate results of this narrow textual focus is Grenberg's reliance on the claim that the definition of feeling in the Metaphysics of Morals first appeared in that book (see especially pp. 112, 120, 196); in fact, Kant had been defining feeling that way for decades (see, e.g., Lectures on Metaphysics L1, from the mid-1770's (28:245)).

[2] She mentions Husserl briefly (pp. 12, 292) but only as an heir to Kant, and there is no discussion of other 20th century phenomenologists.

[3] See, e.g., Christine Korsgaard's The Sources of Normativity (Cambridge University Press, 1996) or Onora O'Neill's Constructions of Reason (Cambridge University Press, 1989), and my Kant's Questions: What is the Human Being? (Routledge, 2013).

[4] Korsgaard, Sources, pp. 123-4.

[5] The language of "experience" is Grenberg's, not Korsgaard's (or, in most cases, Kant's). In chapter two, Grenberg defends in detail her use of the term "experience" and objects to those -- including Korsgaard -- who use alternative language to describe our access to what is first-personal. In the end, I remain uncertain what is gained by using this term, but Grenberg makes clear that this "experience" is a "phenomenological experience" that does not correspond to the "empirical experience" (Grenberg's term, e.g., p. 44) that Kant defines in the Critique of Pure Reason.

[6] There is some tension between Grenberg's emphasis on common moral experience and the equally strong insistence on the importance of an attentiveness that, although possible for all or most people (see 282 for an exception), is a not-particularly-common moral accomplishment. A full discussion of this tension is beyond the scope of this review.

[7] This quotation is from Grenberg's 2005 book, Kant and the Ethics of Humility, Cambridge University Press, p. 133. The two books are linked by a common interest in making sense of what it means to be the kinds of human beings that we are, a deep appreciation for human corruption and its connection to dependence, and moral exhortations to a variety of kinds of humility.

[8] Affectionists include Herrerra, McCarty, Morrisson, Nauckhoff, and Singleton. Intellectualists include Allison, Guyer, and Reath. My own view on this issue, which is conciliatory but broadly affectionist, is defended in Patrick Frierson, Kant's Empirical Psychology (Cambridge University Press, 2014), chapter 4.

[9] A detailed examination of these passages would be tedious for any reader of this review. I encourage interested readers to compare Grenberg's rejection of Allison's interpretation of the Fact of Reason on pp. 142-48 with Allison's original defense of that interpretation.

[10] Grenberg offers a second argument, that because feeling is "merely subjective," it can provide the basis for a kind of "phenomenological experience" that is not of "empirical objects" (42-3) and can thereby support "mysterious wonder at . . . [its] rational, noumenal cause" (285, see too 60f.,196, 222). Her explanation of this argument rests on a highly metaphysical account of this feeling according to which it has a noumenal rather than an empirical cause (see 62), something that in my view conflicts with both Kant's transcendental idealism in general and his particular empirical-psychological claims about feelings, including respect (for details, see Frierson, Kant's Empirical Psychology). But even with this metaphysical account, she moves too quickly from the subjectivity of feeling and the fact that we cannot know ourselves as (empirical) objects to the claim that feeling gives us the only access we can get to ourselves. We are capable of thinking of noumenal things (such as free, rational agents), and direct engagement in practical reasoning can (in something like Korsgaard's practical reflection) show that these thoughts have an object. Thus feeling is not necessary for accessing our noumenal, rational nature. And the subjectivity of feeling, which consists in "representing . . . [only] the agreement of an object or of an action with the subjective conditions of life" (5:9n, cf. 5:204; 15:246, 252; 16:133; 25:167-8, 181, 1501; 7:231; 28:247, 586; 29:891), depends on some antecedent awareness of an object or action and indicates nothing (additional) about that object but only how it relates to us.