Kant's Empirical Realism

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Abela, Paul, Kant's Empirical Realism, Oxford University Press, 2002, 322pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199242747.

Reviewed by Richard Aquila, University of Tennessee


How “realistic” is Kantian “empirical realism”? Mainly by way of commentary on passages from the Analytic of Principles and Appendix to the Dialectic of the Critique of Pure Reason, Abela offers, first, the “priority-of-judgment” view: “Kant…banish[es] the idea of any epistemic intermediary between belief and the world” (35); “there is nothing outside judgment…that informs, constrains, or ultimately grounds objectively valid judgment” (139-40). The ultimate ground is simply the totality of one’s judgments. Second, representation of empirical reality presupposes a grasp of realistic truth-conditions, i.e., conditions construable neither pragmatically nor as mere assertion-conditions (230-49).

On several occasions Abela weakens the first claim, speaking rather only of Kant’s rejection of a determinate “given” or a determinate “subjective foundation” for judgment (e.g., 60, 99, 151). But that must be an understatement. One might think to connect it with Abela’s reading of the Axioms of Intuition and Anticipations of Perception (115-39). There, Kant is said to be concerned with highly “indeterminate” judgments – which Abela equates with empirical intuitions – regarding the extensive and intensive magnitude of sensations (viewed as modifications of one’s sense organs). But there is no epistemic priority here: “the product of these judgments is not, in my estimation, the first line of conscious, cognitive engagement with the world….They do not offer an informative or evidential basis for objective representation” (115). Since Abela formulates the point (a bit misleadingly, to be sure, since the judgments involve concepts) with reference to Kant’s talk about the “blindness” of intuitions, I take it that this is supposed to be Kant’s view as well.

Chapter 1 divides contemporary efforts to honor Kantian realism into attempts to promote whatever degree of realism might be compatible with pragmatic or assertion-condition approaches (Epistemic Humanism) and appeals to “noumenal ‘inputs’” as ultimate sources of sensation, or at least such as are aimed at some sort of account of “regularity” in sensory appearance (Ultimate Realism). Whatever one thinks about the latter, it seems to me misleading to suggest any particular connection with a desire to do justice to Kant’s empirical realism. In any case, it seems to me compatible with the main tenets of Abela’s own reading. The case against Epistemic Humanism is reserved for Chapter 4, which it somewhat artificially shares with the First Antinomy. (Except for the Appendix, the latter is the only part of the Dialectic specifically discussed.)

Here and throughout the book, several references to Graham Bird seem to identify him as the only reliable ally in the debate. But one might wish for more of a sense of how his reading relates to Abela’s. Henry Allison gets a separate section, as an “object lesson.” Though his heart is apparently on the whole in the right place, his distinction between “looser” and “weightier” objects is – I’m not clear why – taken to suggest overfriendliness to a “Cartesian epistemic model” (33). Mainly by way of attention to Quine, Davidson, and McDowell, the chapter concludes with anticipation of Abela’s reading of Kant.

Chapter 2 contains additional stage-setting (Evans, McDowell, Davidson), plus what seems to me unconvincing critique (89-95) of “the causal theory of perception” for at least tacit hostility to the priority-of-judgment view. About half the chapter concerns the Axioms and (mainly) Anticipations, and the role of sensation in relation to empirical “intuition.” At a couple of points Abela seems to identify them: “sensation (empirical intuition)” (50); sensations “obtain” only through the very forms of judging that are constitutive of empirical intuitions (53). But elsewhere he refers to a certain sort of “cognitive structure” in which – by way of indeterminate judgments of magnitude – sensations get “realized as” (126; cf. 127) intuitions. And just before the “obtaining” passage, he puts the point rather in terms of conditions under which sensation are “present to the mind.” At one point Abela also speaks of intuitions as “the subject” of the indeterminate judgments in question (130). But it seems clear that he takes sensations to be their subject. I am tempted to speculate as to why there is some ambiguity here. If there is nothing extra-judgmental to which judgment is (epistemically) responsive – and given his view of “causal theories” of perception – one might hesitate to suppose that, except on a relatively high level of theoretical representation, sensations ever are subjects of judgment. But if not, we may seem left with Kantian intuitions as the subjects of our lowest-level (most indeterminate) judgments. But, for Abela, these are constituted by way of such judgments in the first place.

Though intuitions are not epistemically responsive to sensations, Abela nonetheless emphasizes that we apprehend appearances (meaning: objectively real objects and events) “through” them. He even describes them as functioning as “sensory signs” in cognition. He offers two analogies: representation of rectangular and circular objects through, or on the “basis” of, trapezoidal and elliptical retinal images (118; cf. 198), and the way in which a concert pianist “look[s] through” the notes printed on sheets of music (119n61). In any case, we need to resist the temptation to suppose – as Abela himself sometimes seems to suggest (7, 276) – that sensations are after all epistemic intermediaries in cognition, just not directly so. For again, even the intuitions by which sensations get cognitively “realized” are not “the first line of conscious, cognitive engagement with the world” (115); only the totality of judgments is that.

Now Kant himself says that the “mathematical” concepts concern objects of intuition, while the “dynamical” concepts of the Analogies and Postulates are “directed at the existence of these objects” (B110). And the syntheses introduced by way of the two sorts of concepts pertain, respectively, “partly merely to the intuition, partly to the existence” of an appearance (A160/B199). Furthermore, he speaks repeatedly of appearances, or (Anticipations) a certain aspect thereof, as the subject of our judgments of magnitude. To be sure, Kant also speaks of sensation – but sometimes “the real of sensation” – as the relevant aspect of appearances. A “representing/-ed” ambiguity might explain this. In any case, the upshot seems to be that the dynamical concepts pertain to the existence of those very appearances (or at least would-be appearances) that are the (at least intentional) objects of empirical intuition. But on Abela’s view the objects – or at least “subjects” – of empirical intuition are one’s own sensory states, indeterminately quantitatively represented. Presumably, it is not in judgments specifically in regard to these that the dynamical concepts are supposed to function for Kant.

It seems to me there is an aspect of Kant’s talk about “intuition” that gets neglected if we suppose that he is only talking about states of oneself (judgmental or otherwise) in the first place, as opposed to what might usefully be regarded as at least indeterminately apprehended “perceptual fields” (or discriminable portions thereof), apprehended through states of oneself. And acceptance of the priority-of-judgment view seems to me compatible with maintaining that our first line of cognitive engagement is precisely with such “objects” – and so after all at least indirectly with the sensations “through” which they are apprehended. Of course, consideration of any such reading would have to begin in the Transcendental Aesthetic. In particular, it seems to me reasonable to suppose that at least one of the uses of ‘intuition’ in the Aesthetic – but of course more particularly ‘form of intuition’ – is to capture the fact that multitudes of sensations are both able and need to serve – on pain of cognitive irrelevance – as parts of single states that are instances of the apprehension of at least indeterminately represented perceptual fields. On the other hand, this is not to suggest that – apart from our ability to construe such fields (or at least sub-fields thereof) as actual parts of empirical reality – a “perceptual field” is any sort of real entity in its own right. Apart from such construal, it could be at most an “intentional object” of a relatively indeterminate sort.

This consideration seems to me to bear directly on Kant’s concern with the problem of the synthetic . priori in the Critique. As it happens, this is not at issue in Abela’s study, with respect to either the Aesthetic or the Analytic. Apart from that, his particular version of the priority-of-judgment view leaves me unclear how we are supposed to be able to get beyond the logical forms of quantified predication (and combinations thereof) to judgments sufficiently strongly about (“de re”) this or that portion of some actual (or imagined) perceptual field. One might of course appeal to purely causal (or other “contextual”) relations. But though I’m not clear why, again, Abela sees “causal theories” as friends of the enemy (89ff). A second possibility is that what makes any judgment (sufficiently strongly) about any bit of reality is determined only by way of the totality of judgments itself. That would seem to threaten conversion of all “singular” – and so “intuitional” – representation into representation by way of Kantian “Ideas of Reason.” But I wonder if it isn’t what Abela has in mind. Though this is not the place to pursue it, it seems to me that the proposed alternative might be better positioned to deal with this issue.

Chapter 3 focuses on the Analogies of Experience and (with brief attention to the Refutation of Idealism) varieties of scepticism. Abela does not undertake a detailed analysis of Kant’s arguments in the Analogies. Rather, he directs his energies mainly to clarifying how he is rejecting a certain standard approach to the Kantian project. He also focuses mainly on the Second and Third Analogies, reading the First Analogy as primarily “motivated by the requirement of the Second and Third that a self-identical real subject be posited throughout every alteration” (177). One may of course suspect that this understates the ambition of the First Analogy, which seems rather to argue that all change is in fact “alteration” of something (A187/B230-1). In any case, what Abela concentrates on rejecting in the Second and Third Analogies is any reading that takes Kant to be concerned with some question formulated in terms of some supposedly “given” facts regarding a determinate order of perceptions.

Abela’s foil seems generally to be the following question: given certain facts regarding an order of perceptions, what does it take to be in a position to make at least reasonable judgments as to the occurrence of events and the co-existence of objects? Abela’s rejection of this approach turns on rejection of the idea – for which he rightly appeals, among other things, to the Refutation of Idealism – that we are given a determinate order of perceptions in the first place, independently of determinations with respect to objects and events. But to the contrary of any number of versions of what might be regarded as the “standard” approach, Abela takes Kant’s rejection of this idea to be precisely his main concern in the Analogies. In this respect, of course, the Second and Third Analogies make the points, respectively, that determination of an order in perception, when it is perception of an event or of the co-existence of objects, depends on judgment as to a grounding, in the causal powers of objects, of a certain sort of irreversibility or reversibility in perception (156-62).

This does not mean that Abela denies that the Analogies are also meant to establish certain stronger conclusions, namely, that – at least insofar as one judges them to obtain on some sort of perceptual “basis” – every event and every instance of objective co-existence must be judged to involve, respectively, a causally determined transition between the states of affairs comprising the perceived events themselves (164, 170) and reciprocal causal determination of the states of whatever co-existing objects are in question (171-2). But I didn’t get any idea as to how Abela sees Kant as moving – which he says he does, following Bird, with “no gap” in the argument (173) – from the weaker to the stronger conclusions.

As for his claim about the main point of the Analogies in the first place, namely, that it concerns the underdetermination of any order of perception in the absence of objective considerations, Abela makes what seems to me too heavy use (e.g., 147, 152) of Kant’s claim, in the Second Analogy (B238), concerning a respect in which the subjective order of perception needs to be regarded as “derived” from the objective order of objects and events. Someone who does not read the Analogies as specifically concerned with the general problem of underdetermination might still take Kant’s point about “derivation” to be central to the Analogies. One might do that, namely, just insofar as one takes the point to be that a necessary condition for judging that an event has occurred, or that objects are co-existent, does indeed require regarding one’s perceptions as subject to an order grounded in causal relations between objects and perceivers. By the same token, it is not clear to me why Abela sees preeminent opponents in commentators emphasizing specific concern with conditions for the reasonableness of judgments with respect to events and objects, on the basis of a supposedly “given” order of perceptions (146, 148), as opposed to those concerned with what is entailed or presupposed by mere judgment regarding such matters in the first place, at least insofar as they are supposed to be perceptually based.

Of course, given Abela’s general view of the problem of “underdetermination,” determinations regarding an order in perception must always already be integrated within a complex of determinations, including judgments about causal relations between objects and perceptions. But this is compatible, first, with an absence of determination as to whether any particular determinate order of perceptions is in fact the perception of either an event or of co-existing objects. Second, without further argument it also seem to say nothing as to whether the complex of judgments in question needs to include the specific judgments that every event has a cause and that all co-existing objects (or substances) are mutually determinative with respect to their states.

Thus, whether or not Kant is read as concerned with conditions for the reasonableness of judgment regarding objects and events, as opposed to something more strictly entailed or presupposed by such judgments, and still granting that there is a general problem of underdetermination, in the absence of objective considerations, the Analogies might still be read in terms of questions that “start” from some order of perceptions, on the basis of which one is then supposed to make judgments of objective reality. They might still be so read, namely, precisely as part of an attempt to argue for those stronger claims for which Kant is arguing in the Analogies.

Chapter 3 also includes a discussion of the intelligibility of various sorts of scepticism. Here I would only note that the unintelligibility of “global scepticism,” as argued by Abela, is taken by him to follow from premises including what seems to me acceptance of the “redundancy theory” of truth. I emphasize this because, to the possibly at least apparent contrary, he derives the unintelligibility of global scepticism from the unintelligibility of any answer to the question “What is the general truth-structure false with respect to?” (206), together with what he calls Kant’s acceptance of a “primitive correspondence relation between thought and reality” (207). (The latter Abela seems somehow to find in the Refutation of Idealism.) But so far as I could tell, the desired conclusion follows only given the redundancy theory as to what such “correspondence” is supposed to mean in the first place.

Apart from what may not be a greatly useful discussion of the First Antinomy, Chapter 4 contains Abela’s argument against Epistemic Humanism, that is, against any sort of pragmatist or assertion-condition approach to truth-conditions. The problem here seems to me to lie in the claim, against the latter, that one would require such tolerance in the formulation of assertion-conditions as to undermine any claim to an alternative to full-scale “realism.” Here Abela focuses mainly on judgments in regard to the past (“If an observer had been present here 4 million years ago…”). In this respect, I had to wonder whether some attention to Arthur Melnick’s recent work might not have provided at least material for a somewhat deeper discussion.

In what seems to me by far the most textually sensitive part of the book, Chapter 5 focuses on the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic and the idea of the systematicity of nature. While it may no doubt be accepted altogether apart from the priority-of-judgment view, Abela relates this at least to his view that judgment always operates holistically. While he grants that it does not wholly obliterate the distinction between “constitutive” and “regulative” principles, Abela also takes it to render the distinction between the Analytic and Dialectic less sharp than it seems to me one might still maintain, given acceptance of his overall reading.

Obviously, this is a highly controversial reading of Kant. I cannot say that I felt that Abela did much to render it convincing. But perhaps somewhat paradoxically, and in any case symptomatic of the Protean fascination of Kant, whether or not he held the view that Abela ascribes to him, the supposition that he might have done so seemed to me eminently effective as a vehicle for discussion of some topics of recent epistemological debate.