Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: A Critical Guide

Placeholder book cover

Jens Timmermann (ed.), Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: A Critical Guide, Cambridge UP, 2010, 234pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521878012.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Foreman, Saint Louis University


This engaging collection of essays on Immanuel Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals covers a wide range of issues raised by Kant's seminal work. Included are interpretive and critical essays concerning Kant's conception of character, the role of happiness and inclination in Kant's arguments, Kant's rejection of earlier moral theories, how to understand "dignity" in the humanity formulation of the categorical imperative, and the metaphysical arguments (or lack thereof) in the arguments of the third section of the Groundwork. There are eleven essays in total. In some cases these essays are in conversation with each other (although not explicitly), offering distinct interpretations of key arguments (for example, to what degree the arguments in the third section are metaphysical), and in some cases they stand alone in the collection as treatments of specific issues that arise in the work (for example, Alison Hills's essay concerning Kant's conception of happiness and the role it plays in the arguments of the Groundwork).

In the interest of space, I will briefly discuss only three representative essays from the volume. This means that I will not be able to discuss most of the excellent essays in this collection: Hills's essay concerning Kant's conception of happiness and how it can provide us with an assertoric imperative ("Happiness in the Groundwork"); Robert Louden's essay concerning the role of examples in Kant's philosophy -- that is, their importance to, as well as their insufficiency for grounding, morality ("Making the Law Visible: The Role of Examples in Kant's Ethics"); Robert Johnson's modest first step in closing the gap between the fact that an agent has to act on universally valid laws and the requirement that these laws be universally willable ("The Moral Law as Causal Law"); Katrin Flikschuh's essay arguing that metaphysical claims must not be ignored as part of Kant's arguments for the categorical imperative (especially the kingdom of ends formulation) ("Kant's Kingdom of Ends: Metaphysical, Not Political"); J.B. Schneewind's essay evaluating Kant's "sole survivor" argument against all other moral principles ("Kant Against the 'Spurious Principles of Morality'"); John Skorupski's essay that argues for the "Disinterested Will" as the way to ground impartiality in autonomy ("Autonomy and Impartiality: Groundwork III"); Paul Guyer's thorough analysis of the metaphysical nature of Kant's argument in the third section (arguing for the interpretation that the argument from freedom to the moral law is the argument that the moral law is the causal law of the noumenal self) and his discussion of how to solve the problems that this raises ("Problems With Freedom: Kant's Argument in Groundwork III and its Subsequent Emendations"); and, finally, Frederick Rauscher's essay concerning the non-ontological and not merely theoretical use of the "intelligible world" in Kant's arguments in the third section ("Freedom and Reason in Groundwork III"). All of these essays are engaging and well-argued -- drawing on diverse sources from within Kant's own work and from his commentators -- which is in keeping with the tenor of the collection as a whole.

The collection opens with an essay by Manfred Kuehn entitled "Ethics and Anthropology in the Development of Kant's Moral Philosophy", in which Kuehn argues that (despite Bernard Williams's arguments to the contrary) Kant did not neglect character in his ethical theorizing. Kuehn argues that if we pay attention to Kant's lectures on anthropology, we can see the influence of ideas of character and the importance of virtue in Kant's thinking. However, attempts to make his abstract ethical work more applicable to everyday life by reading Kant's overall project as a virtue-ethical one would be a mistake. According to Kuehn,

If we wish to translate Kant's pure moral philosophy into something more practical, that is, if we wish to do moral psychology of the Kantian sort or apply his pure moral philosophy, we should pay heed to what Kant says about character and therefore also to his lectures on anthropology. Kant's philosophical development can thus tell us something about Kant's 'applied ethics' … [However] contemporary discussions which ascribe to Kant's published writings on morals a kind of virtue ethics confuse different levels of discourse that Kant meant to keep separate, namely the level of everyday morality and the rational and a priori account of morality, which is freed of anything that might be empirical and anthropological. For this reason, they distort his view of the virtues. (p. 25)

That is, Kant's ethical writing, when taken as a whole and situated in historical philosophical context (particularly, according to Kuehn, situated in conversation with the Christian and Stoic notions prevalent at the time, most notably the work of Johann Gellert), is alive with, and sensitive to, notions of character and virtue. However, his grounding project in the Groundwork should not be read as part of a virtue-ethical project, but as a different kind of project altogether.

This essay displays many of the virtues of the collection as a whole -- it weaves historical information about Kant and his contemporaries together with a close look at his writings taken as a whole. However, of all the essays in this collection, it is the most historically-focused and the least closely engaged with the Groundwork. Although Kuehn mounts a nice case for Kant's concern for character (and the influence that the work of contemporaries such as Gellert had on his thinking), the essay does not contain as much philosophical discussion as one would like of the connection of Kant's account of character to his discussions of moral concepts and principles in the Groundwork. Kuehn makes some remarks on this topic in the third section of the essay, including these:

Without getting into the details, it appears to me that we must say that Kant's categorical imperative is not so much concerned with the evaluation of particular acts, but rather with the evaluation of enduring principles which these acts merely exemplify. Thus, the categorical imperative does not and should not be required to tell us what to do in particular situations. Rather, it is about rules that are to be the permanent characteristics of a good will … In other words, maxims are rules as they are willed when we adopt a certain character. (p. 23)

Although argument for this particular interpretation does not seem to be the primary intent or focus of this essay, the essay would have been more philosophically interesting had it provided more argument for this claim. That it does not makes this lead article the least engaging of the eleven that make up this volume.

The rest of the collection is less historically-focused (although not lacking in historical interpretation) and engaged more directly with issues in the Groundwork. In his essay entitled "Dignity and the Formula of Humanity", Oliver Sensen argues that the standard ways of interpreting Kant's arguments about the dignity of humanity are mistaken and saddle him with dubious claims about value that he never meant to make. Ultimately, Sensen argues that Kant never meant to assert that there is a non-relational value property of rational beings that grounds their dignity (thus grounding the requirement to respect them); instead, he argues that freedom gives rational beings a relational worth, and the duty to respect them comes directly from the first formulation of the categorical imperative. Properly understood, the first formulation, in demanding that we only act on maxims that can be willed as universal laws, implicitly limits the ends we can set to those that can also be set by others -- that is, the humanity formulation is just a way of looking at the demands of the first formulation of the categorical imperative from the point of view of the recipient of the proposed action. Thus, the duty to respect others is not grounded in the non-relational value of rational beings, so Kant need not assert anything as dubious as the claim that rational beings have absolute value as a non-relational property.

Further, Sensen argues, when Kant claims that rational beings have dignity and value as ends, we can understand these claims as consistent with the argument that Kant does not posit a non-relational value property in rational beings. Sensen writes:

when [Kant] talks about the 'dignity of humanity' he is expressing the view that human beings are special in nature in virtue of being free (i.e., in a pre-moral sense elevated over the rest of nature). When he talks about the dignity connected to morality, he is saying that morality is raised above all else in that only moral dictates should be followed unconditionally. (p. 116)

On Sensen's view, we can understand the special status Kant affords humanity, and the requirement to respect humankind that comes with it, without making any sweeping metaphysical claims about the value of that humanity.

Although his essay is interesting and persuasive, Sensen stumbles a bit in his attempt to deal with Kant's claims about non-rational beings -- i.e., with his claim that they are mere things with only relative worth as means. Sensen says:

The idea seems to be that non-rational beings do not possess freedom, and are therefore mere playthings of nature. But why does this lack of freedom give things the normative status as means? Why do human beings not have a direct duty to respect them? The key point in answering these questions seems to me to be a matter of burden of proof. Kant rejects the view that there is a value property 'out there' (in heaven or earth) on which one can then base the requirement to respect either humans or non-rational beings … If there is no value property that could justify the requirement to respect non-rational things, then the burden of proof is on the defender of such requirements." (p. 114)

That is, Kant's arguments do not rest on the assertion of a grounding value-property in rational beings (or the lack of such a property in non-rational beings); since the requirement to respect persons comes from their freedom in line with the categorical imperative, no similar move for establishing a duty to respect non-free non-rational nature is possible. Kant's arguments, on this line of thinking, are not speciesist arguments about the value of humanity; they are arguments that derive morality from facts about rational nature that just don't happen to apply to non-rational beings.

Sensen may be right that this is in fact what Kant meant to argue (I will not engage that issue here), but the invocation of "burden of proof" does not help matters much. If Sensen is right that the "dignity" of humanity merely denotes the special quality of freedom in rational beings, that is not much help for the claim that everything else has only relative worth or value only as a means. Even if dignity is understood as relational, as Sensen argues it should be, the fact remains that everything else in the world should be valued only as a means for rational nature. The problem is not that Kant can't explain why we must respect non-rational beings. It is, rather, that his moral system results in a hierarchy that can't explain why non-rational things are of any moral consequence except as they relate to rational beings. Sensen's reading may take the metaphysical oomph out of this hierarchy, but that does not solve the worry that troubling value claims are still being made about non-rational beings (relational though those claims may be, if Sensen is correct). This may be less metaphysically loaded than the standard interpretation, but it's not clear that it is any more palatable normatively. (Sensen is obviously not obliged to solve this problem for Kant, but his dismissal of the problems associated even with this non-standard understanding of dignity seems too quick.)

Finally, Jens Timmermann's essay:, "Acting From Duty: Reason, Inclination and Moral Worth", is an interesting examination of the much-maligned Kantian contention that the only acts that have moral worth are those that are purely motivated by duty. According to Timmermann, Kant's dualistic conception of human volition underlies this contention, and once that is properly understood, there is no reason to be concerned by the rigor of this idea. Timmermann writes:

All action involves both an object of volition and a law. As regards moral value, the decisive question is whether the formal or the material element takes precedence in the process of decision and subsequent execution of a 'dutiful' act, i.e., an act that, on the face of it, conforms or coincides with duty. An agent is either interested in the realization of an object because he is interested in the action itself, which is directly commanded by the moral law; or because he is interested in acting in a certain manner for the sake of bringing about an object that appeals to him … Kant is systematically developing the theme of the incorruptible, sturdy, and self-reliant nature of morality, grounded solely in practical reason, as opposed to the fickle and unpredictable support actions that accord with duty may hope to receive from inclination. (pp. 55-56)

On Timmermann's reading, Kant's "motivational rigorism" is a result of the fact that Kant is not interested in evaluating particular actions by looking at their effects -- rather, he is mainly concerned to develop an account of ethics that is concerned with the agent's character. For this reason, it is important that his attention be focused on the "attitudes human beings take towards their desires when they make themselves felt, and the principle(s) that then apply" (p. 58). Timmermann's arguments in defense of Kant's notion of moral worth are insightful and engaging. Particularly good are the arguments he offers (in the fifth section of his essay) against efforts to soften Kant's motivational rigorism -- that is, against those who claim that duty is a "backup motive", or that actions that are in line with duty and an agent's own inclinations are "over-determined". Timmerman argues persuasively that these ways of understanding Kant's thesis do not do justice to the problem that acting out of inclination poses, nor to the importance of Kant's insistence that actions done from duty are motivationally different from actions done out of inclination.

This collection of essays is diverse and engaging. The essays are of wide theoretical interest and deftly address issues of interpretation along with broader normative issues arising from Kant's Groundwork. Striking a nice balance of interpretive and normative concerns, each essay draws on a wide variety of sources, including not only Kant, but also his sympathetic commentators and his detractors. Those in either camp are well-advised to give these essays their attention.