Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: An Introduction

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Sally Sedgwick, Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 205pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521604161.

Reviewed by Lara Denis, Agnes Scott College


This book is a commentary on and introduction to Kant's Groundwork. It aims "to convey Kant's ideas and arguments as clearly and simply as possible, without getting lost in scholarly controversies" (ix). The book consists of five chapters: an introductory chapter setting Kant's Groundwork in philosophical context and laying out some of its main themes and arguments, and a chapter on the preface to and each of the three sections of the Groundwork. The book contains a short, well-chosen bibliography which includes biographies, classic works in Kant scholarship, recent monographs, and scholarly articles. The index is brief but helpful; many entries contain useful sub-entries. The book's target audience is students in their first or second encounter with Kant's Groundwork. Sedgwick does not presuppose previous experience with Kant, ethical theory, history of philosophy, or philosophy generally. The book is extremely well suited to serve as a required text for students in this group; it would also make a good optional or recommended text for more advanced students.

Sedgwick's book is part of a series, Cambridge Introductions to Key Philosophical Texts, which strives to lead readers through central themes and arguments of important works in Western philosophy. The series seeks to provide readers with the historical and philosophical contexts of the works in question, as well as with a sense of the influence of these works. Sedgwick does not touch much on the influence of Kant's Groundwork. She does, however, provide the philosophical context for understanding it. She achieves this primarily by drawing on other works of Kant's to explain ideas alluded to, and arguments given, in the Groundwork. For example, Sedgwick takes great care to explain Kant's notion of a metaphysics of morals, and his later project in the Metaphysics of Morals, so as to show how the Groundwork functions as a Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. To a lesser degree, she draws on other theories in the history of philosophy to elucidate Kant's thought. An example of this is her account of Hume on causality and freedom, and Kant's response to Hume (15-18). She also considers Kant's Groundwork in terms of ethical theory, discussing deontology and teleology (57-58). All these discussions are accessible to students for whom the topics in question are new.

The strengths of this work are too numerous to cover completely. I will divide those I discuss into two main categories: those having to do with the substance of Sedgwick's account of Kant's arguments and ideas, and those having to do with her manner of conveying her interpretation. In both cases I am mainly concerned with the book's merits in relation to its stated purpose.

Sedgwick pays ample attention to such core ideas as the good will, the categorical imperative, and autonomy, while also explaining Kant's project, methods, and strategies. The introduction explains that the Groundwork is supposed to provide the fundamental principle not only for the Doctrine of Virtue but also for the Doctrine of Right within the Metaphysics of Morals (5-8). It also makes clear how Kant's project in the Groundwork differs not only from the Metaphysics of Morals, but also from works in applied ethics (4-5). Sedgwick takes admirable care working through Kant's preface, mining it for clues to Kant's aims for the book as a whole and his methods in each section. She considers how we should understand the title of each section of the Groundwork, as well as of the text as a whole. This keeps the reader attuned to what Kant takes himself to be doing at any given time, and renders many of his moves far less mysterious than they might seem without such attention to context. Sedgwick takes the time to explain many of Kant's technical terms in ways that are both philosophically careful and comprehensible to the novice. Whether it is a discussion of various meanings of "metaphysics" or of the distinction between perfect and imperfect duties, she leaves readers neither wondering what Kant is talking about nor awash in jargon. Although she does not explore Kant's ideas here with the depth she could in a work for specialists, she does not give the impression of glossing things over.

Sedgwick confronts some common, natural objections to Kant, such as the concern that the good will must oppose inclination and that Kant's theory is objectionably rigoristic (66-68, 128-31). These discussions are surprisingly rich for their brevity. Sedgwick's account of Kant is sufficiently sympathetic to allay the most pressing concerns of her readers while still inviting further thought. Footnotes point readers to additional literature on these topics. On the whole, Sedgwick's interpretation of the Groundwork is charitable and compelling in ways that encourage readers' continuing exploration of Kant's philosophy.

Sedgwick's interpretation highlights certain key concepts, using them to create through-lines for her readers. One such concept is that of a good will. Another less expected concept, which she carefully relates to that of a good will, is that of a pure will. Kant introduces the notion of a pure will in his preface, saying that "the idea and principles" of such a will are the proper subject matter of the metaphysics of morals (4:390).[1] Kant uses this term only once more in the Groundwork, near the end of section three, when he says, "[all] my actions as only a member of the world of understanding would … conform perfectly with the principle of autonomy of the pure will" (4:454). Sedgwick identifies a pure will with "the capacity to act from a priori laws or principles" -- a capacity she equates with autonomy -- and holds that it is in virtue of our having a pure will that human beings are ends in themselves (133 n37, 144, 139). Furthermore, Sedgwick takes Kant to refer to a pure will when he talks about "an absolutely good will" within the section three claim that the principle "an absolutely good will is that whose maxim can always contain itself regarded as a universal law" is synthetic rather than analytic (4:447). Sedgwick's explicit attention to Kant's important but easily overlooked notion of a pure will, and her relating of that notion to Kant's conceptions of a good will, humanity, dignity, and freedom, are both distinctive and helpful.

Perhaps the most distinctive feature of Sedgwick's commentary is her use of Kant's theoretical philosophy, and in particular his arguments in the Critique of Pure Reason. In the introduction, she draws on Kant's theoretical philosophy to explain two bases for Kant's rejection of an empirical grounding for morality: it is incompatible with the universality and the necessity of moral principles (14), and it is incompatible with the freedom that is a necessary condition of morality (19). In both the introduction and chapter five, which provides commentary on section three of the Groundwork, Sedgwick patiently develops Kant's notions of freedom and reconstructs Kant's arguments for the permissibility, justifiability, and necessity of regarding ourselves as free (18-28, 183-98). She emphasizes the theoretical (as well as the practical) necessity of so regarding ourselves, and explains why, in her view, we must attribute transcendental freedom (rather than a more minimal, less metaphysical sort of freedom) to ourselves. The attention that Sedgwick pays to freedom -- and the expertise with which she draws on Kant's first Critique to elucidate Kant's Groundwork assumptions and arguments about freedom -- is without a doubt one of the most valuable aspects of this book. It is perhaps also the feature that most recommends this book for use by more advanced readers.

The accessibility of this work owes much to Sedgwick's writing style. Her sentences are usually short, even during the most complex discussions. In both the introductory chapter and near paragraph-by-paragraph commentary, she manages to write in a manner both unhurried and concise. The detailed commentary is broken down into small chunks with helpful headings (in addition to Kant's own divisions). Sedgwick unobtrusively provides just enough repetition, summary, and preview so that the reader knows where he's been, where he's going, and what's important. Sedgwick's reconstructions of Kant's arguments are clearly presented. The reader can see not only what the structure of the argument is, but what the argument is supposed to accomplish.

One thing that impresses me about this work is that it constantly models strategies for philosophical interpretation and critical reading. Sedgwick often explicitly raises and works through questions about ambiguous terminology, apparently contradictory claims, competing readings of a passage, or ways that different claims might relate to one another. She does these things in a way that promises to sharpen a student's own sense of what to look for and wonder about in his reading, as well as how he might attempt to solve interpretive problems he encounters. For example, right after Sedgwick has quoted Kant's second proposition of morality, "an action from duty has its moral worth not in the purpose to be attained by it but in the maxim in accordance with which it is decided upon" (G 4:399), she states:

There is something odd … about Kant's insistence here that the moral worth of an action has to do with its maxim but not with its purpose. It is odd because he elsewhere seems to imply that a maxim or principle of volition is nothing other than the expression of an agent's purpose. (71)

Sedgwick then goes on to explore several ways we might understand Kant here, and to provide a brief, text-based argument for one interpretation: "He means … that an action does not have its worth in any purpose or end set by desire or inclination" (72). Even if one did not agree with this reading, one could not but admire the natural manner in which Sedgwick integrates the teaching of critical reading and text-based argument into an informative commentary on a difficult philosophical work. This pedagogical aspect of the book makes it beneficial to students beyond the help it provides them in understanding Kant's Groundwork.

The weaknesses, limitations, or gaps in the book are few. Given the nature of the work, they are both unsurprising and benign. There is very little criticism of Kant. Sedgwick's emphasis is on helping students understand Kant's arguments and ideas. She presents Kant charitably, largely explaining away apparent confusions or ambiguities. This is not an unreasonable approach. It seems good to teach students to read and interpret charitably when one is initially trying to understand any text -- and especially one that is both so important and yet so potentially frustrating. Criticism can come later. This further step is one Sedgwick's readers must take mostly on their own, perhaps aided by secondary sources to which she refers in her notes or bibliography.

It may be inevitable that specialists in Kant's ethics will find that certain passages or themes in the Groundwork receive less attention from Sedgwick than they would like. For example, Sedgwick does not much attend to Kant's section two summary argument at 4:437-39. She discusses some of the ideas contained in it, e.g., Kant's linking of the first two formulations of the categorical imperative to each other and to the good will. But there are several interesting questions raised by this argument that Sedgwick does not address, such as whether the argument for the formula of humanity given in it differs in any illuminating way from Kant's earlier argument for it.

Similarly, it seems unavoidable that many will find something to disagree with or question in Sedgwick's interpretation. Since Sedgwick tries to avoid engaging in discussion of interpretive disagreements, we might wish at times to know more about why she reads Kant one way rather than another, and what else she has to say on a given topic. For example, in explaining Kant's illustration of the formula of humanity in relation to the imperfect duty to promote others' happiness, Sedgwick suggests that the duty of beneficence reflects respect for other human beings as rational beings because unhappiness tempts people to transgress their duty; we exercise our practical rationality better when we are satisfied with our condition (142). This seems to give happiness a merely instrumental value as a means to morality, contrary to Kant's account of the place of happiness within the highest good (5:110; 59). It also overlooks other ways in which promoting others' permissible ends appears to show respect for others as rational beings. Although I found Sedgwick's interpretation of Kant generally compelling, I sometimes longed for a fuller development of certain parts of it.

These complaints are minor: they mainly point out ways in which teachers of the Groundwork, particularly those who work on Kant, will want to reach beyond Sedgwick. What she has done is provide a lucid, detailed, accessible, richly informed introduction to, and commentary on, Kant's Groundwork. This book is a highly valuable contribution to student-focused literature on Kant's ethics.

There are, of course, many treatments of Kant's Groundwork, including some recent commentaries. Sedgwick's commentary is geared more toward undergraduates, while Jens Timmermann's Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary (Cambridge 2007) is more suited for use by graduate students and faculty. Her book is more accessible than the introduction and argument analyses in the Thomas E. Hill, Jr. and Arnulf Zweig edition of Kant's Groundwork (Oxford 2002). It is worth noting that Sedgwick's quotations from the Groundwork draw from the Cambridge Edition translation by Mary Gregor (in Practical Philosophy, 1996). Nevertheless, I would not hesitate to use the Sedgwick commentary in conjunction with a different translation of the Groundwork in courses for which I found a different translation preferable. Sedgwick's use of the Academy pagination facilitates the book's use with a variety of translations. The Hill-Zweig edition is the only edition of the Groundwork in English that I am aware of -- including other supplemented editions -- the use of which would render the Sedgwick commentary redundant, at least as a required text, given its own copious commentary. For other editions of the Groundwork, this is a wonderful companion.

[1] Citations to Kant's Groundwork and Critique of Practical Reason list the Royal Prussian Academy volume number (4 for the Groundwork; 5 for the second Critique) and page number. Translations are from Mary Gregor, Practical Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).