Kant's Human Being: Essays on His Theory of Human Nature

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Robert B. Louden, Kant's Human Being: Essays on His Theory of Human Nature, Oxford University Press, 2011, 222pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199768714.

Reviewed by Leslie Stevenson, University of St Andrews, Scotland


A slightly odd title -- and the image on the cover suggests the pleasant fantasy that Kant had a secret mistress who was given to gazing into dark pools in the forests around Konigsberg! But this is of course a book centered on Kant's concept or conception of human nature. It is a collection of essays written for other occasions, rather than a through-composed work, and it contains quite a lot of repetition -- to my mind, rather too many trees looking much the same (as in those Prussian forests). But Louden's historical scholarship is very impressive: he seems to have read and digested not only Kant's extensive published works, but all the sets of student lecture-notes, plus many major and minor eighteenth-century writers, and much relevant secondary literature.

As well as writing and lecturing on his famously original and heavy-duty philosophy, Kant delivered series of popular lecture-courses on anthropology, geography, and education for much of his university career. (What a workaholic he must have been -- clearly there could have been no time for a mistress!) Indeed, he did much to get those areas going as academic disciplines, as part of the grand Enlightenment project. If you want a summary of what was in Kant's popular courses without having to wade through all those lecture notes of questionable accuracy that publishers are still bringing out, then Louden's your man in Part Three of this book. He finishes with an investigation of Kant's stereotyped remarks on national character in the early Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime, which despite its title has little to say about aesthetics. It does seem that in his popular lectures and writing Kant relied too much on such stereotyping. This was especially unfortunate in his treatment of race, and Louden finds no evidence that Kant rose above the racist prejudice typical of his period, however much we might like to think otherwise. He was also typical of many philosophers in not taking much trouble to get his empirical facts right: for example, at one point he asserted that children's blood temperature is higher than that of adults, so they do not need to be kept warm (see p. 195 n. 10). Mistress or not, Kant can't have had much to do with children, except with their minds, in his early days as tutor to aristocratic families.

Louden has done the intellectual community (especially historians of ideas) a useful service in researching this material so thoroughly and giving us a readable digest of the results, even if the results are somewhat meager philosophically. But I do not wish to damn this book with faint praise, for in the first two parts Louden offers a more substantial contribution to philosophy which will richly reward anyone interested in Kant's ethics and his conception of human nature (two closely-intertwined topics) from both the historical and the systematic points of view.

In Part One, Louden argues against the stereotype (still too common, even amongst philosophers who should know better) of Kant as a stern imposer of exceptionless moral rules, the very paradigm of a rigid deontologist who ignores the rich heritage of the ethics of virtue bequeathed to us by the classical philosophers and their Christian successors. Some Kant-scholars have gone to the other extreme, protesting that he offered primarily an ethic of virtues rather than an ethic of rules. Louden offers us a middle way, that Kant quite rightly does both. The phrase 'virtue ethics' has become fashionable but it is vague, for after all, it is difficult to see how ethics could not be concerned with virtue in some way! However, the main point is to take as the most fundamental ethical question what sort of people we ought to be, rather than what results we should strive to bring about or what kinds of action we should do or refrain from doing.

The usual understanding of Kant as obsessed with rules comes presumably from brief acquaintance with the Groundwork (or worse, with superficial summaries of it in student textbooks), where the focus is usually on "the" categorical imperative and Kant's rather questionable deductions of perfect duties from it. However, the Groundwork begins with the statement that the only thing that is good without qualification is a good will. Some may say that all Kant means by that is that behind each particular action there should be an intention to obey the relevant moral rule, but Louden argues that what he really means is that each person should have, throughout their life, a settled disposition to guide their life and actions by respect for moral law. He offers a similar understanding of Kant's technical but ill-defined term 'maxim' as not so much the intention behind each particular action but rather the more general underlying intention that orchestrates a whole series of actions. In the late Metaphysics of Morals Kant formulates two "necessary ends of reason" that he says all rational agents have a duty to adopt as their guiding principle for the whole of their lives, namely, one's own moral perfection and the happiness of others. Louden claims that the duty to develop one's own moral character is the linchpin of Kant's entire system of duties (p. 11). Our emotions are not enemies to this project, they ought rather to help, but they need to be restrained and directed aright. Indeed, Kant says we need to cultivate "a habitually cheerful heart" so that we can act with joy (pp. 12-15).

In the rest of Part One Louden expands on the themes of duties to oneself, self-mastery or moral strength, and the role of the emotions in the moral life. In his account of humility, Kant presents a middle way between pagan self-assertion and Christian denial (p. 26): we find in ourselves a respect for the moral law but also temptations to allow exceptions to it in our own case, to satisfy our self-interested desires; hence Kant's doctrine of radical evil and our lifelong struggle with selfish inclinations (pp. xxvii, 31-4, 107-120). So his account of the ethical life is darker than that of the classical philosophers and has something in common with the Pauline doctrine of original sin. In the last paper of this section Louden suggests that Kant could have welcomed Jane Austen's Mansfield Park as a valuable source of insight into human nature (p. 39), despite the warning in his anthropology lectures that reading novels "makes distraction habitual"! However, in several versions of those lectures he is reported as saying that novels can help us acquire an understanding of human nature, and Louden applauds that thought.

Louden describes Part Two -- "Anthropology and Ethics" -- as the core of this book, and it should be studied in conjunction with his substantial Introduction (pp. xvii-xxviii). Kant wrote in at least three places that "What is the human being?" is the most fundamental question in philosophy. Yet there is no particular place where he answers it, not even in the anthropology lectures. It is rather a pervasive theme that recurs throughout his oeuvre, and he offers no complete or final answer, not because of carelessness, but because he thinks no such answer is possible, given our freedom what to make of ourselves. Kant does think there is such a thing as human nature, namely a set of (basically biological) characteristics that is shared by all normal members of our species, and he allowed as a real possibility that there may be other species of rational beings elsewhere in the universe with a different biology. Besides having a biological nature as all animal species do, we are distinctively rational. But Kant's conception of rationality is rich and deep, we are not merely instrumentally rational in choosing means to achieve our end, we are substantively or teleologically rational in our ability to deliberate about which ends to pursue and our freedom to determine our ends on a rational basis. Thus Kant agrees with existentialists who insist that we have an inescapable freedom to choose, but he would certainly dissent from the view that our fundamental choices are arbitrary, beyond all rational debate.

Kant recognizes that we are ineradicably social beings (indeed, that is part of our biological nature), and also that the forms human society has taken have varied widely over time and place. His lectures on anthropology are studded with examples of such variation (though he relied on sources that were limited and not entirely reliable). Like other philosophers of the Enlightenment and the historicist philosophers who followed him, Kant had a vivid sense of how human cultures had developed in history, and he entertained hopes of further cultural development in a progressive, enlightened direction. Recent studies of primates have been claimed to show that they too exhibit "culture", i.e., some distinctive patterns of behavior in different social groups that are passed on through social or observational learning. But Kant's conception of human culture is deeper and richer: for him, culture involves substantive rationality and freedom of choice, it is something that can be consciously improved upon by successive generations (pp. xxii-xxiv), though we can also slip backwards into chaos and evil, as history shows. Louden argues that the moral dimension dominates all other features of Kant's conception of human nature (p. xxvii). His popular lectures were entitled "Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View": they were designed to help his hearers understand themselves and others, to promote "enlightenment for common life" (p. 51) -- a kind of Weltkenntnis that Kant complained most moral philosophers and clergymen lack (p. 57)! He hoped to make people better citizens of their nation and of the world, and he presented a vision of a gradually emerging worldwide community, extending slowly outwards from its Eurocentric core (p. 59). Progressive education has a vital role to play in this. Overall, the Kantian view of human nature is that we are influenced very strongly by our biology, our upbringing and our culture, but not determined by them. Whether that combination can be made consistent is of course a large question for Kant and for us all.

The rest of Part Three elaborates on these themes, with a certain degree of repetition. Despite that slight cavil, this is an excellent book which will deepen its readers' understanding of Kant on human nature, and of human nature itself.