Kant's Lectures on Anthropology: A Critical Guide

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Alix Cohen (ed.), Kant's Lectures on Anthropology: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 270pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107024915.

Reviewed by Martin Sticker, Georg-August-Universität Göttingen


Now that there are Cambridge Critical Guides for Kant's major works, Cambridge University Press is adding lesser-known works, such as Kant's Lectures on Anthropology, to the series. In her introduction, the editor Alix Cohen admits that these lectures have long been ignored and "deemed a peculiar collection of more or less pointless remarks on a variety of random topics vaguely related to human beings" (2), and that they are criticized for their "stereotyping, prejudice and bigotry" (2). Yet, the last twenty years have seen a revival of scholarly interest in them. Cohen's volume is part of the ongoing rediscovery of Kant's empirical (or impure) philosophy. This rediscovery has helped to correct or mitigate some long-standing misunderstandings, for instance the notion that Kant is only interested in abstract, transcendental matters and that he pays no attention to the social and historical embeddedness of human existence.

According to Cohen's introduction, there are three main reasons why attention to the Lectures on Anthropology can enrich current debates. Firstly, as the course of lectures most frequently taught by Kant over the span of thirty years (from 1772/3 to 1795/6), they help us follow and understand transformations in Kant's thought. Secondly, they afford insight into how Kant's anthropological thought is integrated with his transcendental philosophy and his other writings. Thirdly, they help us flesh out the empirical dimensions of Kant's philosophy.

I propose to add a fourth reason: Kant's anthropology is pragmatic. Pragmatic anthropology differs from science (such as empirical anthropology and empirical psychology) in its standards, methods and goals. As Cohen rightly states, Kant intends his lectures on anthropology as a way to help students "make their knowledge relevant, applicable and useful" (1) and to convey material to his young students that would be useful for many aspects of their lives. The lecture notes on anthropology therefore also help us to understand what Kant thought the responsibilities of academics (himself included) towards the public are, and how philosophers can and should engage and educate the public. I will discuss this theme first, and then the essays that do not develop this point.

Gary Hatfield argues that in the Lectures on Anthropology Kant's pragmatic aim with regard to the senses is to explain to his students the nature of illusions and the workings of their senses. For this purpose Kant starts from the "everyday phenomenology of sensory experience" (39) of his audience. He makes use of scientific, psychological theory for a deeper explanation of this phenomenology and to facilitate his pragmatic purpose. Kant aims to distinguish his pragmatic anthropology both from empirical psychology and from physiology, which is the study of human beings according to nature or as part of nature, not as what they make of themselves. Hatfield's essay, in addition to containing useful material about Kant's notion of sense, is also an exemplary study of the pragmatic aim of Kant's anthropology and of how and to what end Kant draws on scientific theory in order to facilitate this aim.

Alix Cohen's contribution is a rich discussion of the anthropological dimension of Kant's account of cognition. She argues that Kant "not only acknowledges the empirical, contingent and messy features of our cognition," but that his account "also helps us become better, more efficient knowers" (76). Cognitive differences between different human beings and the diversity of human talents are nature's means to secure the two natural purposes of humanity: cognitive survival and progress of the species. Natural and cognitive differences result in antagonism and disagreement. For the resolution of disagreement we need to develop our cognitive capacities. Furthermore, we need to institute laws or procedures to regulate disagreement and antagonism. Cohen then criticizes Kant. His Lectures on Anthropology are supposed to "provide the empirical knowledge we need to succeed and reach our vocation" (85). The problem is that Kant seems to think that our faculty and process of cognition are not in our control and we therefore cannot improve them (Cohen cites XXV:488 for this). Cohen argues against Kant that an agent has sufficient control over cognitive matters. We have control over what to investigate, and it is up to us to withhold judgment. Most importantly, we have control over our epistemic principles or our way of thinking. Pragmatic anthropology therefore can be of assistance for Kant's audience and readers.

G. Felicitas Munzel's essay is about the relation between morality, education and anthropology in the Friedländer notes. In order to show what education can achieve on Kant's framework, Munzel provides an overview of the rational capacities and possible deficiencies of rational agents. Against these deficiencies four levels of constraint are imposed on rational agents: civil order, propriety, moral order, and conscience (in other writings, these four are respectively called discipline, cultivation, civilization, and moralization). These constraints establish conditions under which morality can develop. The philosopher can facilitate this development by educating the educators who in turn educate the broader public. The moral formation of the human being is made possible by nature, but is only realized by education. Munzel's stimulating contribution shows the potential of Cohen's volume at its best: our understanding of an important and puzzling issue, the role of education in Kant, is illuminated via material from the Lectures on Anthropology. My only complaint is that Munzel's discussion of the intricate question of how agents can make a transition from pre-moral rational capacities to morality on pages 187-88 is far too short, and the answer simply does not become clear. The reader will wonder as much as before how society and education can facilitate the first steps to moral agency.

John Zammito closes the volume with another fine example of how Kant's Lectures on Anthropology are pragmatic. He notices that despite changes in Kant's philosophy and in the anthropological knowledge of the time, Kant's conceptions of the characteristics in his lectures, encompassing a discussion of temperament, personal character, national characters, the sexes, races, and the species as a whole, remains largely unchanged over thirty years. Zammito argues that this is the case since the living circumstances of Kant's pupils did not change considerably. Kant therefore thought no changes necessary in order to fulfill anthropology's pragmatic goal. His aim was to teach his young hearers something useful for their lives without overburdening them with theory, and he thought the characteristics can help students make sense of and deal with people and that they are generally accessible. Zammito emphasizes that, even though Kant claims that his teachings concerning the characteristics are systematic and empirical, or grounded in observation, they are a "practical guide" (235) and not science.

Kant believes that philosophers can and should philosophize about a great range of subjects and can engage the public with useful lessons from all areas of philosophy. If philosophers start from everyday phenomenology or ordinary elements of human existence and articulate these elements clearly and in a systematic manner, the audience can benefit from this with regard to a great variety of subjects (the senses, cognition, psychology, etc.). Kant's method and goals in his anthropology lectures show surprising similarities to his ethics, which, according to the Groundwork, starts from "common moral rational cognition" (IV:393.3), systematizes and vindicates this cognition and, finally, is supposed to serve moral educators as a guideline for improving the public (IV:391.34-392.2, V:163). I believe it would be interesting to discuss in what sense this is a general structure of Kant's philosophy and pertains also, for instance, to his political philosophy, theoretical philosophy and his aesthetics. The essays in Cohen's volume that I just summarized make a valuable contribution towards this.

The essays in Cohen's volume fall, roughly, into three groups: Essays 2-5 (Makkreel, Hatfield, Tim Jankowiak and Eric Watkins, Cohen) discuss cognition; essays 6-8 (Patrick Frierson, Paul Guyer, Allen Wood) discuss affects, passions, inclinations and desires; and essays 9-13 (Susan Shell, Munzel, Catherine Wilson, Robert Louden, Zammito) discuss themes centered around education, progress and cosmopolitanism. Most of the third group of essays, namely, the essays by Shell, Munzel and Wilson (and less so Louden), primarily shed light on the pre-critical Kant and in particular on the Friedländer lecture notes from the mid-1770s. Apart from the four essays I already discussed, I want to draw attention to two more that I found particularly interesting.

Patrick Frierson's focus is the Lectures on Anthropology's moral assessment of affects and passions. Passions are disordered inclinations or disordered desires and evil; affects are disordered feelings. Frierson discusses why Kant thinks that only passions are evil. The answer, according to Frierson, is that affects bypass choice and do not give rise to actions in the strict sense of the term: "we might say that affects are an absence of free agency rather than a misuse of it" (111). Actions under the influence of affects cannot be imputed. By contrast, we are responsible for actions in the heat of passion, since passions do not exclude rational deliberation. One of the noteworthy features of Frierson's discussion, which in general exhibits impeccable scholarship, is that he focuses not only on the moral significance of affects and passions but also on their prudential significance: both affects and passions can lead us to act against our own best (prudential) interest.

Robert Louden discusses how the central elements of Kant's anthropological conception support nature's ultimate aim: cosmopolitan unity. Kant assumes that all living creatures have inherent purpose and that this purpose will eventually be realized. This adds a prescriptive dimension to his anthropology. Anthropology can function as a map for future development, if we can discover the inherent potential of human beings as a species. Louden offers an interesting account of Kant's idea that nature's purpose, a perfect civil constitution or peace can be achieved indirectly via conflict and unsocial sociability. He also reminds us of how realistic Kant considers the prospect of mankind achieving its final purpose: Kant shifted from "it will take thousands of years" in Friedländer (XXV:696), to "it is only a regulative idea" in his Cosmopolitan History a decade later.

Let me finally briefly summarize the themes of the other essays. Rudolf Makkreel discusses how Kant's notion of self-observation and self-cognition developed from the conception of an inner sense and intuiting ourselves in non-phenomenal ways into a form of self-assessment and cognising oneself in terms of what one can make of oneself. In a lucid essay Tim Jankowiak and Eric Watkins argue that the Lectures on Anthropology supplement Kant's First Critique account of a priori cognition with a conception of empirical cognition. The First Critique focuses on sensibility in general (space and time), and explains the a priori conditions for cognition to be possible. The lectures focus on the individual sensory modalities and on the empirical conditions requisite for cognition to be actual, and they tell us how our cognition can be object directed, intersubjective, how objects can be cognized as substantial, what the contribution of the imagination is for cognition of objects, and how our understanding can be perfected as well as fall into deficiency.

Allen Wood partly covers the same ground as Frierson. Wood discusses the difference between inclinations and desires; his essay contains interesting thoughts on passions and their social nature. Wood stresses the role of the social world for the forming and content of inclinations, desires and passions. Paul Guyer discusses how and since when the central notion of Kant's critical ethics was reflected in the Lectures on Anthropology. Guyer takes this central notion to be that the freedom to set one's own ends and to set these ends in harmony or consistently with the ends of others is the necessary end of all rational beings. According to Guyer, Kant asserts the existence of an inclination to one's own freedom as the condition of the possibility of one's own happiness early on in his lectures. Only around Naturrecht Feyerabend and the Groundwork does Kant introduce the notion of freedom as an intrinsic value and as something suited to be an end in itself. Guyer argues that, according to Kant's developed conception, instead of turning into a "violent passion" (132), our inclination toward our own freedom can be developed into an enthusiasm for the freedom of all. The essays of, Guyer and Wood, have similar strengths and weaknesses. They both provide additional material for Guyer's and Wood's respective prominent readings of Kant. For those who are not already convinced of these readings, however, the essays will do little to change their minds.

Susan Shell proposes to make use of the Friedländer lecture notes in order to better understand Kant's silent decade preceding the publication of the First Critique. She offers an overview of these lectures, and her essay will be of particular interest to those interested in Kant's notions of Gemüt ("heart" or "mind") and character. Catherine Wilson discusses how the anthropology lectures reflect Kant's stance towards three important intellectual notions of his time: secularism, animalism (seeing man as in continuity with other animals) and historical or cultural pessimism as advanced by Rousseau and Buffon. Kant is a proponent of secularization, rejects animalism (or at least emphasizes that we should consider human beings also as rational beings), and rejects historical pessimism.

Due to the high standard of the Cambridge Critical Guides in general, my expectations for the volume on the Lectures on Anthropology were high. Cohen and her authors, on the whole, do not disappoint. However, let me close by pointing out two things I missed in this overall fine collection that certainly will enrich our understanding of Kant's notion of anthropology, cognition, desires and passions, education, progress, psychology and biology, and the role of academic philosophy.

Firstly, the Lectures on Anthropology have a much more difficult publication history than, for instance, the Groundwork. They are lecture notes taken by Kant's students. Some of these notes were later published as a version authorized by Kant, while others exist in unauthorized versions. I was hoping for a discussion of how reliable these manuscripts are as an indication of Kant's authentic views. After all, his lectures were subject to a number of external constraints, such as the conventional anthropology curricula, expectations of his audience and his audience's ability to comprehend material. Such a discussion does not take place in Cohen's volume, though Werner Stark, in the volume's first essay, provides some useful facts, figures and background information, in particular with regard to the role of Baumgarten and the influence of Rousseau and Pope on Kant.

Secondly, Cohen acknowledges that the volume leaves out detailed discussion of Kant's contentious views on race and gender. This is a shortcoming since these issues have recently become of considerable interest. The volume, however, does contain brief discussions of these issues by Zammito (241-44) and Wilson. Wilson (204-06) argues that even in Kant's time there were people such as Condorcet, Hippel and Home with a more modern understanding of race and the sexes than Kant's, and that Kant's views were certainly not uncontested at the time. In addition, Louden (223-24) argues that racism is an integral part of Kant's notion of progress and that the notion of progress is important throughout Kant's entire philosophy.