Kant's Metaphysics of Morals: A Critical Guide

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Lara Denis (ed.), Kant's Metaphysics of Morals: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 270pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521513937.

Reviewed by Andrews Reath, University of California, Riverside


Kant's Metaphysics of Morals: A Critical Guide is a collection of new essays by established and distinguished scholars on central topics in Kant's Metaphysics of Morals. The anthology is part of the Cambridge University Press "Critical Guide" series, which aims at essays that break new ground and advance critical discussion of canonical philosophical texts. Many of the essays in this volume do just that. There are essays on the Introduction to the Metaphysics of Morals, the Doctrine of Right, and the Doctrine of Virtue. The volume is not intended as a cooperative commentary on the entire book, but it does provide a fairly comprehensive guide to interpretive and philosophical questions raised by the Metaphysics of Morals, including its relation to the Groundwork and Critique of Practical Reason.

Kant first refers to the project of a "metaphysics of morals" in letters from the mid-1760s, but the work with this title did not appear until 1797. Manfred Kuehn traces the changes to Kant's idea of a metaphysics of morals and its relationship to his Lectures on Ethics from different periods. He notes that the content of the "metaphysics of morals" -- the actual system of duties -- remains relatively constant from the pre-critical period, though there are (of course) significant shifts in Kant's foundational picture. Kuehn takes issue with Allen Wood's claim (in Wood 2002) that Kant relies primarily on the Formula of Humanity, rather than the Formula of Universal Law, to derive the duties articulated in the Doctrine of Virtue. Kuehn acknowledges that "the categorical imperative" (by which I take it he means the Formula of Universal Law) plays "a rather subdued role in the entire book." (24) However, Kant does think that this formula leads to the obligatory ends, and the duties of virtue are based on these ends. Moreover, Kuehn explains the limited role of the categorical imperative through two points. First, the duties of virtue are based on our essential ends, and Kant does not think that there is a significant philosophical problem in seeing what these ends are. Second, the role of the categorical imperative is to explain what it is to will morally, and not to specify what our actual duties are. (25, 26)

Stephen Engstrom's essay, "Reason, Desire and the Will", is an extended discussion of Kant's conception of the faculty of desire at Metaphysics of Morals 211-214, a section that is both central to his moral psychology and not easily unpacked in all its details. The essay leads up to an account of what Engstrom has elsewhere (Engstrom 2009) called Kant's "practical-cognitivist" conception of the will as a rational faculty of desire -- a conception based on Kant's identification of the will with practical reason. As exercises of reason, acts of volition are forms of cognition: they are essentially judgments about good that are derived from principles (and that take themselves to satisfy a condition of universal validity). But such judgments are also forms of desiring that can be causally efficacious: they are representations of objects that strive to realize their objects. The essay includes a discussion of reason (both theoretical and practical) as a capacity for knowledge from principles and a general discussion of the faculty of desire as the life power of a living being. In the latter, Engstrom points out that Kant conceived of desiring as a form of causality and thus activity, and that while he recognizes that some desires arise through affection, Kant thought it a mistake to build passivity into the concept of desire (to do so is to assume by fiat that reason cannot move the will). (37-8) Engstrom has a novel reading of Kant's distinction between will [Wille] and the power of choice [Willkür] as referring to the cognitive and the causal moments of volition. Roughly Wille arrives at ends through principled judgment of what is good. The charge of Willkür is not to choose whether or not to follow Wille, but rather to carry out the judgment of Wille -- to form a representation of an action within an agent's powers, which representation is to determine one's agential powers to realize the end represented as good. (44-45, 47, 49) This essay is one of the best in the collection and essential reading for understanding Kant's conception of the will.

Katrin Flikschuh addresses on-going questions about whether Kant's Doctrine of Right is part of his moral theory. Some scholars have argued that, because juridical law-giving is external -- because principles of right may be coercively enforced and compliance need not be from moral motives -- that it is not part of his moral theory. She argues that it is, but that it is a distinctively public morality, the principles of which are not autonomously self-legislated in the way that moral principles (or the moral principles that are part of ethics) are thought to be. One point at issue here is that while the authority of ethical principles comes from the fact that they are self-legislated, that feature does not transfer to the principles of right. As Flikschuh puts it, in the Groundwork the Wille that imposes law and the Willkür that is to follow reside in the same person, but not in the Doctrine of Right, where the law-giving authority is a united public will giving law to individuals that it may coercively enforce.

Otfried Höffe is concerned to show how Kant uses the one innate right to freedom as a criterion for grounding a set of universal human rights (through the four "authorizations" contained in the innate right: innate equality, being one's own master, being beyond reproach, and the authorization to do what does not diminish another's right [Kant 1996, 6: 237-8]). He provides commentary on Kant's concept of right, the universal principle of right and the connection between right and authorized coercion. Kant says that the innate right belongs to each person "by virtue of his humanity" (Kant 1996, 6:237) and appears to assign a foundational role to the duty of "rightful honor" not to make oneself a means for others. Höffe provides an interesting discussion of this point, arguing that Kant bases the innate right on an ethical duty to oneself to assert one's own worth rather than, as one might expect, on a juridical duty to others. Legal standing as a person with rights depends in the first instance on an act of self-recognition. "Only those who constitute themselves as legal entities are suitable subjects of legal relationships," since "only they are able to claim a space within which to be free." (85, 86)

Sharon Byrd explains Kant's account of the right to own external objects, which is central to Private Right. The innate right to freedom gives individuals a right to move their bodies without restriction, but it does not analytically contain the right to own external objects of choice, under which Kant includes property rights in things, rights to actions of others created by contract, and status rights. The possibility of such acquired private rights requires what Kant calls a "postulate of practical reason". (Kant 1996, 6: 246) Byrd unpacks the argument by which Kant introduces private rights, explaining how such rights exist in the state of nature and are the basis of a duty to enter a juridical condition. On the reading of the postulate that is standard among commentators that she cites, the postulate leads to a permissive law that justifies acts that would otherwise be wrong (e.g., appropriation of unowned objects). Byrd argues persuasively that Kant did not think that such appropriation is wrongful. The postulate is thus not a "justification" in the legal sense, but a power-conferring norm that extends the innate right of freedom to the right to have external objects (in all three categories) as one's own.

Allen Wood points to tensions in Kant's theory of punishment. Several scholars have recently argued that Kant accepted a mixed theory of punishment, according to which the institution of punishment is justified on grounds of deterrence but is to be administered according to retributive principles. Wood argues instead that Kant's basic justification of the institution of punishment is retributive. But Kant thought that given such a justification, the state may use punishment for the ends of deterrence, indeed that it must use punishment for the end of enforcing a rightful condition. However, Wood argues that Kant provides no systematic support for his retributivism. His more satisfying justification of punishment appeals to the authorization to use coercion to enforce rights, but this account is not retributivist. Wood concludes that this lacuna is a weakness in Kant's ethics. Wood thinks that there are strict retributivist limits on justified punishment and that it is a shortcoming of Kant's moral theory that it provides no support for them. This essay is useful in sorting out the different strains within Kant's discussions of punishment.

In the Introduction to the Doctrine of Virtue, Kant lists moral feeling, conscience, love of neighbors and self-esteem as "aesthetic preconditions of the mind's receptivity to duty". (Kant 1996, 6: 399) Paul Guyer attempts to untangle the connection between these psychological dispositions and the feeling of respect as characterized in the Groundwork and second Critique. Guyer suggests that the feeling of respect (and moral feelings more generally) are phenomenal manifestations of the noumenal (i.e., rational) determination of the will by the moral law. More specifically, Guyer reads certain passages in the second Critique to treat the feeling of respect as an empirical cause of moral action that is part of a phenomenal or empirical etiology of moral action. The "aesthetic preconditions" in the Doctrine of Virtue lead to a multi-staged model that modifies and adds detail to this account and represents "Kant's final empirical theory of the etiology of moral action." (132, 138) Guyer suggests that Kant's empirical causal theory of moral action is promising and provides a more satisfactory account of the genesis of moral conduct than his transcendental idealist theory of freedom, which one might want to consign to "the dustbin of history."

Jeanine Grenberg's question is what the "enemy of virtue" is in the Doctrine of Virtue -- inclination or a condition of the rational will. The Doctrine of Virtue at first appears to identify inclination as the opponent of virtue, in contrast to Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, which clearly takes the second route. But more careful reading identifies vice as the opponent of virtue, and since vice is a condition of the will, the differences between the two texts are insignificant. Following a discussion of the connection between virtue and inner freedom, Grenberg traces the difference between Aristotelian and Kantian accounts of virtue to different fundamental concerns: Aristotelian virtue is concerned to order the appetitive part of the soul that shares in reason, while Kantian virtue is concerned to combat a condition of the will.

Lara Denis does a nice job of explaining the primacy that Kant assigns to perfect duties to oneself within his classification of duties by documenting the tight connection between these duties and free agency. She compares Kant's accounts of perfect duties to oneself in the Collins lectures, Vigilantius lectures and the Doctrine of Virtue. These accounts differ in interesting ways, but a common theme is that actions and maxims that violate perfect duties to self directly undermine the conditions of free moral agency and the associated dignity of the individual. The primacy of perfect duties to self is explained by their immediate connection with the capacity for free moral agency.

In claiming that we have duties only to human beings, Kant draws a distinction between the being to whom one has a duty and the being with regard to whom one has a duty -- for example (and notoriously) we can have duties regarding animals, but they are to oneself. Robert Johnson offers an account of the "to" relation, defending the principle that one has a duty to someone only if that person has some claim or right that one perform a certain action. (193, 203) This account fits narrow or perfect duties, but many commentators reject it because it is unclear that it can accommodate wide and imperfect duties. The duty of beneficence is a duty to others, but since Kant held that no individual has a claim or right to any act of assistance, the "to others" in this case is not readily explained through an enforceable claim. However, Johnson argues that this principle can be supported by correlating the imperfect duty of beneficence with a kind of collective right: in virtue of our membership in the species of human rational agents, each of us has a right that agents generally adopt the happiness of others as their end, and each of us has standing to blame an agent who does not adopt that end. (My standing to blame does not come from the fact that a person has failed to help me, but from the fact that the person has not adopted the obligatory end.) This approach to beneficence may have some merits, but it seems to me to depart from Kant by going too far in assimilating wide duties to perfect or strict duty.

Patrick Kain argues that Kant's view that we have duties regarding, but not to, animals is more reasonable than is generally supposed. Standard criticisms are that Kant fails to give animals any moral standing in their own right and that the reasons we have for treating them decently are instrumental -- e.g., that cruelty to animals increases the likelihood that someone will treat humans badly. Kain gives an interesting discussion of Kant's views about the nature of animals, including his views about animal cognition and choice. The main point of his defense is to argue that Kant's view is that, given the nature of animals (as living creatures with a faculty of desire and the capacity for various kinds of feelings), they "properly engage our morally significant feelings." (223)

Thomas E. Hill, Jr. provides a general discussion of the normative content of the Doctrine of Virtue. In addition to clarifying certain features of Kant's normative theory, Hill compares features of Kant's theory with standard contemporary views and defends some features that now tend to be rejected (such as the primacy of duties to oneself). Among other things, Hill discusses the relation of first moral principles to more specific principles and conclusions, the role of natural purposes in some of Kant's specific duties, and his basic understanding of duties to oneself. He points out that Kant bases duties to oneself in a kind of rational self-regard that is plausible and that appears in many contemporary theories -- e.g., that rational agents have a fundamental interest in exercising and preserving their own rational powers and ability to live among others as equals. (246) While many of Kant's duties are first-order duties about actions and ends, Hill observes that certain duties -- to strengthen conscience, self-knowledge, and moral perfection -- are second-order duties to develop capacities needed to counter moral negligence, self-deception and weakness. (246-9) He closes with an attractive interpretation of Kant's requirement to act from moral incentives: rather than a requirement to strive to make duty our conscious motive, Hill understands it as the requirement to take on a basic commitment to moral principle and the priority of moral considerations. (249-54)


Engstrom, Stephen (2009). The Form of Practical Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Kant, Immanuel (1996). The Metaphysics of Morals, edited and translated by Mary J. Gregor, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (Cited by volume and page of the berlin Academy Edition).

Wood, Allen W. (2002). "The Final Form of Kant's Practical Philosophy," in Mark Timmons, ed., Kant's Metaphysics of Morals: Interpretive Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.