Kant's Metaphysics of Morals: Interpretative Essays

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Timmons, Mark, (ed.) Kant's Metaphysics of Morals: Interpretative Essays, Oxford University Press, 2002, 446pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0198250106.

Reviewed by Pawel Lukow, Warsaw University


One of the more perplexing aspects of Kant’s practical philosophy is the relationship between his earlier works in moral philosophy, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals and Critique of Practical Reason, and The Metaphysics of Morals. Part of the difficulty stems from the different methodological status of the latter work. In the Metaphysics, Kant builds a theory of justice and virtue, whereas in the earlier works he explores the rational basis of morality.

Since the Metaphysics is about principles of action and the earlier works put forward (various versions of) the principle of justification of principles of action (i.e. the categorical imperative), the crucial question for an adequate understanding of Kant’s practical philosophy is about the relationship between the principles of right and virtue and the categorical imperative. First, an interpreter needs to be clear whether the fundamental principles of right and virtue are derived from or justified by the imperative; or whether they are, or can be seen as, relatively independent from it. Secondly, a related question concerns the role of the imperative in Kant’s practical philosophy as a whole. According to the textbook interpretation, Kant believed that the imperative can by itself answer all central questions about morals. The Metaphysics, by contrast, suggests that the imperative is one, although central, among many elements of moral thinking.

It is the relationship between Kant’s earlier works in practical philosophy and the Metaphysics that is the leading theme of Kant’s Metaphysics of Morals: Interpretative Essays edited by Mark Timmons. In this collection of excellent essays, some of which were presented at the 1997 Spindel Conference commemorating the bicentennial of the publication of The Metaphysics of Morals, leading Kant scholars discuss various aspects of this work and Kant’s practical philosophy as a whole.

The seventeen essays collected in the book can be divided into two large groups. Papers of the first group address questions of political and legal order and the place of Kant’s political philosophy in his practical philosophy. The topics of most other essays are related to the fundamental question of practical deliberation and motivation. As mentioned above, all essays explore in their own ways the relationship between Kant’s metaethical and ethical views. In my presentation of the essays, I shall follow this leading theme, diverging from their order in the book, where they are organized according to the sequence of topics in the Metaphysics.

Allen Wood’s opening essay challenges the dominant picture of Kant’s moral philosophy as reducible to the test of the categorical imperative from which all principles of justice and virtue are to be derived. Wood points to those aspects of the Metaphysics of Morals which question the typical rigorist and anti-teleological interpretation of Kant’s practical philosophy, according to which matters of moral value are centered around action in abstraction from emotions, consequences and character. In particular, stressing the analyticity of Kant’s principle of right (from which principles of justice derive), Wood argues for the independence of the principle from the categorical imperative. This claim is the subject matter of the next three essays.

Thomas W. Pogge agrees with Wood and defends Kant’s political philosophy as independent from transcendental idealism and critical practical philosophy, with a view to making Kant’s liberalism acceptable to citizens of modern political societies. Pogge argues that Kant’s argument for political society can be seen as based on an analysis of the idea of a juridical order. This analysis generates rules of interaction of beings each of whom has an interest in the greatest possible freedom. Pogge adds that the independence of the argument for the juridical order from the rest of Kant’s critical philosophy is consistent with Kant’s claim that the principle of right is entailed by his practical philosophy. Kant’s liberalism can be arrived at by an analysis of the idea of juridical order, apart from his critical practical philosophy.

Paul Guyer rejects this interpretation of Kant’s political philosophy. Guyer convincingly argues that the analyticity of a proposition does not imply that it does not need justification or derivation. The logical correctness of an argument does not prove the objective reality of what is proven. Drawing on textual evidence, Guyer says that the principle of right is derived from the concept of freedom (which is accessible to agents in the form of the categorical imperative). Deduction of this principle belongs to Kant’s practical philosophy, which is embedded in his transcendental idealism.

Bernd Ludwig draws a similar conclusion. Using Pogge’s analytic approach, Ludwig explains that Kant’s political theory cannot be separated from transcendental idealism. To see the juridical order as based on an analysis of the concept of such an order, one has to have an understanding of who the “units,” i.e. persons, that participate in that order are. Since Kant thinks of persons as free causes, his understanding of persons must be rooted in transcendental idealism’s idea of causation. A similar dependence, Ludwig says, can be found in Kant’s argument for property rights, which rely on his idea of practical reason.

The subject of property rights is addressed to a greater extent by Kenneth R. Westphal who focuses on the contradiction in the conception test of the categorical imperative (in its version as the Universal Law of Right). Westphal argues that property rights are necessary for finite beings who live under the conditions of scarcity of space and resources and who attempt to achieve rationally their ends. Property rights are means of protecting human beings’ pursuit of their ends.

The exchange of arguments among Woods, Pogge, Guyer, and Ludwig is fascinating. It shows how the ideas of an influential philosopher of the past can provoke a genuine debate that is relevant to citizens of contemporary societies. In this respect, Thomas W. Pogge’s proposal seems particularly interesting since – despite the difficulties posed by the conceptual, if not argumentative, dependence of Kant’s theory of justice on his critical philosophy – it is an effort to include Kant’s philosophy in what Rawls called overlapping consensus.

The chapters discussed above address the most fundamental questions of justification of the principles of justice. Sarah Williams Holtman and Sharon Byrd discuss particular theses of Kant’s political philosophy. Holtman argues against Kant’s often-criticized claim that revolution is never permissible. She explains perceptively that Kant’s own thesis that the point of the state is to secure the carrying out of justice by providing an impartial interpretation of principles of justice requires that revolution be justifiable when state institutions and laws are obviously unjust, i.e. when the state does not perform its proper function. Holtman’s argument is especially important because of its “global” character. She takes into account not only Kant’s particular theses but also the spirit of his philosophy of right.

Sharon Byrd in turn discusses Kant’s theory of contracts but her approach differs from that of Holtman’s. She provides a detailed analysis of some key concepts of Kant’s theory of contracts to clarify his division of rights transferable through contracts as based on his general theory of contracts. For Kant a contract consists of two “sub-contracts”: the obligation-generating agreement to transfer something in a specified way from one party of the contract to the other, and the agreement to transfer rights to the thing contracted from one party to the other. Byrd also draws analogies between the division of rights transferable through contracts and the table of categories from Kant’s first Critique.

Papers by Marcus Willaschek and Katrin Flickschuh concentrate on the question of motivation and performance of duties of justice. In his insightful paper, Willaschek notes that according to Kant juridical laws require compliance irrespectively of the agent’s motives. This, however, generates a paradox: if obedience to an unconditional law presupposes no other motives than willingness to do what the law requires, then juridical laws cannot be unconditional or, if they are, they cannot prescribe actions. Willaschek proposes to solve the paradox in a very ingenious way. He considers Kant’s thesis that juridical laws represent the rightful condition of society and concludes that they contain only an authorization of agents to use coercion against those who upset this rightful social condition.

Katrin Flickschuh contrasts Kant’s account of desires with their modern understanding as subjective and unreasoned units in practical deliberation and links it to the ancients’ view of the matter. She suggests that, according to Kant, desire formation in political and economic contexts is constrained by the requirements of practical rationality, so that it is neither unreflective and beyond agents’ control, nor morally neutral. This conception of desires is closer to its ancient forerunners and provides an alternative to the modern view known from the economic and political literature.

The remaining essays of the book discuss Kant’s Doctrine of Virtue but they are significant for the interpretation of Kant’s entire practical philosophy. Onora O’Neill’s thoughtful paper addresses the central topic of Kant’s view of practical deliberation and the role of judgment in it. Commenting on Kant’s treatment of moral conflict, O’Neill argues that practical deliberation does not involve only mere application of principles but also designing appropriate responses to particular situations. This is due to the fact that the constraints of principles of action require satisfaction in all situations, even though it may sometimes be impossible to satisfy them all. Since the appropriate moral response to a situation should satisfy the constraints of all principles, or of as many of them as possible, practical judgment should be seen as inseparable from deliberation. O’Neill’s paper is especially valuable since it locates Kant’s moral philosophy in recent debates concerning the role of judgment in moral life. O’Neill provides both arguments and textual evidence that support the thesis that a Kantian view of practical deliberation is much more nuanced and in agreement with moral experience than it is usually supposed.

Robert N. Johnson discusses a comparably fundamental question of the relationship between some of Kant’s claims about human nature and his view of practical rationality. Having considered a number of interpretations, Johnson says that it is impossible to reconcile Kant’s thesis that happiness is a natural or pre-reflective end of human beings with his thesis that rational beings always choose the ends of their actions.

Papers by Thomas Hill, Jr., Mark Timmons, and Stephen Engstrom discuss more specific questions of moral motivation. Hill examines Kant’s claim that motivations for obedience to the law do not affect the moral worthiness of action. Hill brilliantly argues that in Kant’s philosophy conscience should be seen as a way in which agents become aware of moral requirements. By drawing parallels between Kant’s conception of conscience as an internal moral “tribunal” and Kant’s view of punishment, Hill proposes to understand the threat of punishment for unlawful behavior not as a motive for compliance but as a way of reminding citizens of their duty to abide by the law.

Mark Timmons argues that in order to preserve a central Kantian distinction between morality (moral worthiness) and legality (rightness) of actions, the motive of duty should not be seen as a condition of rightness of actions. Timmons also argues that Kant rejects the thesis that rightness of actions is independent of agent’s motives because motives are elements of act descriptions, which are taken into account in moral assessment of actions.

Engstrom convincingly shows a way to reconcile Kant’s understanding of virtue with the traditional view of it as a habit. By focusing on Kant’s thesis that agents’ practical freedom is proportionate to their virtue, Engstrom links Kant’s idea of virtue as moral strength in opposing passions to his notion of freedom and self-governance. On this account virtue involves a harmony of motives, which makes the agent resistant to determination by affects and passions. The advantage of Engstrom’s line of argument is that it has strong textual support, makes Kant’s conception of virtue close to the common understanding, and at the same time shows the historical links of this conception to the views of the ancients and Kant’s contemporaries.

Essays by Andrews Reath and Nelson Potter present two different interpretations of Kant’s conception of duties to oneself. Reath holds that Kant’s notion of duties to oneself should be seen from the perspective of the idea of self-legislation by agents who recognize that the principles they propose must satisfy certain deliberative requirements (universalizability). Reath interprets universalizability in an unorthodox way as a requirement that has to be satisfied by actual members of societies, which presupposes a conception of morality as a common enterprise of a plurality of agents in which duties to oneself are requirements of membership in society. In opposition to Reath and closer to the textual evidence, Potter argues that for Kant ethical as opposed to legal duties are relatively loosely linked to the social character of human action. Potter emphasizes Kant’s thesis that duties to oneself are the foundation of morality because they express and preserve the moral capacities of human beings. This centrality of duties to oneself can be appreciated by noting the moral-educational aspect of some violations of duties to oneself, as can be seen in the corrupting effect of self-deception on the agent’s moral personality.

In the final chapter, Marcia Baron discusses Kant’s account of love and respect as opposed to each other and compares it to the modern-day understanding of the two. Baron suggests that the large discrepancies between Kant’s and contemporary understandings of love and respect for others are due to the importance he attached to agents’ freedom and self-direction.

Kant’s Metaphysics of Morals is an extremely valuable book. First, it is devoted to one of the most neglected of Kant’s works. It examines various aspects of his practical philosophy and often shows it in a new light. Despite the variety of topics and approaches, the book’s chapters are surprisingly complementary, giving the reader a fairly comprehensive view of Kant’s theory of morals. Although the book is often very demanding, anyone interested in Kant’s practical philosophy will certainly want to learn from it. Secondly, the book’s value is not only exegetical. All the authors treat Kant’s practical philosophy as more than a bit of history. They devote a lot of effort to arriving at an adequate understanding of Kant’s ideas, but at the same time they test the relevance of his theory to the realities of contemporary societies. For this reason, the book is not only an invaluable contribution to Kant scholarship. It is also important reading for all those who are looking for philosophical resources to address moral problems of today.