Kant's Moral Metaphysics: God, Freedom, and Immortality

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Benjamin J. Bruxvoort Lipscomb and James Krueger (eds.), Kant's Moral Metaphysics: God, Freedom, and Immortality, De Gruyter, 2010, 334pp., $126.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110220032.

Reviewed by Paul Guyer, University of Pennsylvania


This volume is a collection of eleven papers on Kant's moral philosophy and related topics in his philosophy of religion, originally presented at two workshops sponsored by the Council for Christian Colleges and Universities and the Society of Christian Philosophers. The lead paper is by Karl Ameriks, and a number of the other contributors were students of Ameriks at Notre Dame. The paper by Eric Watkins was previously published in the Kantian Review and parts of the paper by Andrew Chignell were previously published in the proceedings of the 2005 Saõ Paolo Kant Congress and in the Internationales Jahrbuch des Deutschen Idealismus. Otherwise the material in this volume appears here for the first time.

For the editors, at least, the papers in the volume are animated by opposition to the "school of interpretation, associated with the late John Rawls and his students, [which] sees Kant's practical philosophy as essentially anti-realist" and as separable "from the substantive metaphysical commitments that Kant endorsed in other domains of his Critical philosophy" (3).  By contrast, the authors in this volume are supposed to be "reengaging the controversial metaphysical claims associated with Kant's Critical philosophy" and reading "Kant more holistically" (2). The "students" of Rawls named by the editors include Christine Korsgaard, Onora O'Neill, Andrews Reath, and J.B. Schneewind. By his own account, Schneewind enjoyed conversations with Rawls when the former was a graduate student at Princeton and the latter was an instructor, but it is surprising to see Schneewind described as a "student" of Rawls. This list excludes numerous others who also studied Kant's practical philosophy with Rawls, such as Thomas E. Hill, Jr., Barbara Herman, Adrian Piper, and the present reviewer, who are by no means uniformly "anti-realist" or "constructivist" in their interpretations of Kant. Among opponents of a "metaphysical" approach to Kant, the editors also do not mention Henry Allison, whose "epistemological" rather than "ontological" interpretation of transcendental idealism and his application of this approach to the interpretation of Kant's practical philosophy have been influential for many, including several of the authors in this volume. Of course Allison was never a student of Rawls, so he is not tarred with the "anti-realism" and "constructivism" supposed to have emanated from Rawls.

It is dubious whether there is a single "anti-realist" "constructivism" shared by Rawls and even those of his students who would call themselves constructivists. Rawls himself was careful to limit his own version of "Kantian constructivism" to the derivation of principles of justice from an initial avowedly moral conception of free and equal persons, and it is by no means clear that he was "anti-realist" about the latter. He was also well aware of the role of transcendental idealism and Kant's theory of the postulates of practical reason, and explained them patiently in the ten lectures on Kant that constitute the core of his Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy edited by Barbara Herman in 2000, although he made no use of these aspects of Kant's practical philosophy in the "Kantian Interpretation" of the theory of justice as fairness propounded in A Theory of Justice. Korsgaard and O'Neill (e.g., O'Neill 2003) have been more radical constructivists than Rawls, proposing constructivist accounts of the fundamental principle of morality itself in a way that Rawls never did, and certainly with debatable success. Korsgaard in particular conceives of her version of constructivism, which sets out to derive the fundamental principle of morality from the very "standpoint" of coherent agency, especially in her 2009 book Self-Constitution (Korsgaard 2009), as an interpretation of Kant and not just a position inspired by Kant. But on the whole it seems to me that the editors of the volume make something of a strawman out of the Rawlsian anti-realist, constructivist (and throw in "naturalist" and even "positivist") approach to Kant.

Nobody can doubt that Kant himself thought that the possibility of moral obligation depended upon a kind of free will that could be secured only by his doctrine of transcendental idealism, although his conception of the free will required by moral obligation is generally thought to have changed from the 1785 Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, where he held that the moral law is the causal law of the noumenal will, to the 1793 Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, where his position is that the noumenal will has an "inscrutable" freedom to choose between the subordination of self-love to the moral law and the converse (see Guyer 2006, pp. 213-30). And nobody can deny that Kant thought that the possibility of the object imposed upon us by the moral law, namely the highest good, requires the postulation of immortality and the existence of God, which postulates, since their objects are not given to us empirically, can be considered "metaphysical." Many do deny the plausibility of these indisputably Kantian doctrines and their necessity for understanding the normative content of Kant's fundamental principle of morality and the system of juridical and ethical duties that he builds upon it. Kant himself certainly marks some sort of distinction between the normative content of his moral theory and his metaphysical theory of freedom of the will in his separation of the "analytical" arguments of the first two sections of the Groundwork and the "synthetic" argument of its third section.  Also, in the Critique of Practical Reason the derivation of the postulates of immortality and the existence of God are separated in a "Dialectic" from the analysis of the content of the moral law and the derivation of our freedom from the "fact" of our awareness of our obligation under this law in the "Analytic." At the very least, Kant thereby suggests that the inseparability of the normative content of his practical philosophy from his "metaphysical" claims about the freedom of the will, immortality, and the existence of God must be demonstrated, and opens the door to those who would separate the former from the latter. Of course several of the papers in this volume attempt to demonstrate that the normative and metaphysical aspects of Kant's practical philosophy are inseparable.

One question that is not much asked in these papers, however, is whether Kant thought that neither the possibility of moral obligation nor the possibility of the object of morality but the normative content of the fundamental principle of morality itself must have a metaphysical foundation. Yet a number of Kant's earliest notes about moral philosophy suggest that his most fundamental moral norm, the categorical imperative that we ought to act only on maxims that can be universalized without self-contradiction, is grounded on a metaphysical premise about what we are, namely free wills (though this does not obviously mean undetermined for the Kant of the 1760s), whose essential nature would be, absurdly, contradicted when some of us choose maxims that allow ourselves a freedom that we deny others. Among his very earliest notes on moral philosophy, the notes he jotted in his own copy of the 1764 Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime (partially translated in Kant 2005 and fully translated in Kant 2011), Kant entertained the thought that human beings have as a matter of psychological fact a strong distaste for domination, either by their own impulses or by the impulses of others.  But he also suggested that the denial to others of a freedom that one allows oneself, or for that matter perhaps any denial of one's own freedom itself, is simply a contradiction of the nature of a human being that is "absurd" and for that reason "perverse." As he puts it,

There is in subjection not only something externally dangerous but also a certain ugliness and a contradiction that at the same time indicates its injustice. . . .that a human being should as it were need no soul himself and have no will of his own, and that another soul should move my limbs, that is absurd and perverse (Kant 2005, p. 12; Kant 2011, p. 129).

I am not sure that Kant himself ever found a more convincing argument for the moral law than its derivation from the essential freedom of human beings, a position we might dub "normative essentialism" and which is a far cry from anti-realism. I would have liked to have found in this volume a thorough examination of such a metaphysical foundation for the normative content of Kant's moral philosophy, but I did not.

Having said that, let me describe what the reader will find in this volume. The opening paper by Karl Ameriks, "Reality, Reason, and Religion in the Development of Kant's Ethics," is devoted to the thesis that

from the early 1760s on, Kant was, at the base level of his theory, an ethical purist (never seriously tempted by empiricism), and yet he always supplemented his purism to some degree, and for the most part in a fitting way, when, at a secondary level, he incorporated broadly anthropological considerations and modified his views on various epistemological issues (29).

Ameriks helpfully argues that Kant's attack upon "perfectionism," which might seem to be a blanket rejection of any metaphysical foundation for the fundamental principle of morality, is actually directed only against "traditional" forms of perfectionism (those of Leibniz, Wolff, and Baumgarten) which are either "too vague or else must be conceived as resting wholly on an empirically 'given' end" (30). Here he points to the possibility of a metaphysical foundation for the normative contents of Kant's moral philosophy. But mostly Ameriks is concerned with the role of feeling, such as the feeling of respect, in moral motivation. On this subject he argues that Kant could only come to his theory that the feeling of respect is "self-wrought" by the determination of the will by pure practical reason alone once he had found "some metaphysical way to avoid being restricted by determinism" (38), a claim that needs more defense than he provides; that

The role of respect is to provide an appropriate qualitative factor, between the proper orientation of the will in itself, and its eventual upshot in action, so that Kant can say that his theory, despite its purism, is consistent with the phenomenological fact of the constant presence of feeling in all human action (43),

which is correct; and that Kant's account of the feeling of respect is part, along with his conception of our idea of God and of "religion in general" of a "proper, indirect device to keep human beings who already have moral motivation from losing that motivation in the context of extremely difficult circumstances" (45). The last claim risks lumping together several different points.  One is that our belief in the realizability of the highest good, which according to Kant needs to be underwritten by belief in the existence of God, is necessary to preserve our motivation to be moral from being undermined by the thought of the irrationality of attempting to do what morality commands us to do.  But that the feeling of respect is part of the normal mechanism by means of which the (noumenal) determination of the will by the moral law leads to action (at the phenomenal level of human existence) is a very different, and to my own mind more defensible claim.

The next paper, "Moral Imperfection and Moral Phenomenology in Kant," by Benjamin Lipscomb, one of the editors of the volume, falls into the category of attempts to impute to Kant an a priori argument for the existence of radical evil (see also Morgan 2005 and Sussman 2005). Lipscomb's version of this idea is an argument that "a pure will [has to] be understood as having within it an inextirpable capacity for resistance to reason, in the form of a heterogeneous source of motivation," in order to explain why the feeling of respect takes the form of a painful striking down of self-conceit as well as of a pleasurable feeling of our own power to do just this (59). This seems to me to confuse the presence of inclinations to do something other than morality requires, and perhaps even what we might inelegantly call a meta-inclination to prioritize gratifying our first-order inclinations over obeying the moral law, with a determination of the will to do so, for only the latter could be called radical evil. It seems to me indisputable that Kant's position in the Religion is that it is only the determination of the will to prioritize self-love over morality and not the mere presence of amoral or even contra-moral inclinations that is to be called radical evil. It also seems to me clear that Kant's position in the Religion that the choice between the superiority of morality over self-love or the converse is inscrutable belies any attempt to prove a priori that people must make the latter rather than the former choice, i.e., necessarily are radical evil.

The next paper in the collection, "Two Standpoints and the Problem of Moral Anthropology" by Patrick Frierson, is an attempt to show that the idea of a choice of a fundamental maxim, whether the maxim of the superiority of morality over self-love chosen by the "radically good" agent or that of the superiority of self-love over morality chosen by the radically evil one, can be reconciled with the "two-standpoint" interpretation of freedom of the will, inspired by Allison (see Allison 1983, rev. 2004), which does not posit a metaphysical distinction between the noumenal and the phenomenal (contrary to the ideology of the editors), rather than a "two-world" interpretation, which simply locates this choice in a noumenal act "grounding" intelligible character, by the "anthropological" view that an agent can think of his or her "life as a whole as expressing free choice, in recognizing the challenges posed by radical evil, and in seeing one's struggle against evil as part of a social struggle." The idea is that "In deliberations at any given time, one should see oneself as constructing a life, not merely as deciding on a particular action" (108). I think that this idea, essentially that one must not think of one's choices in isolation but instead consider their implications both for one's own future freedom of choice and action and for the freedom of choice and action of others, is the core of Kant's own central normative idea that, as he puts it in his lectures on ethics, the fundamental requirement for moral choice is always to choose in a way consistent with "the greatest use of freedom . . . the conditions under which the greatest use of freedom is possible" (Kant 1997, pp. 126-7). But I do not think this normative constraint on choice has anything to do with the metaphysical issue of whether choice is determined or not, for which the "two-world" and "two-standpoint" interpretations of transcendental idealism are supposed to be competing accounts.

Frierson's paper is followed by Jeanine Grenberg's paper "In Search of the Phenomenal Face of Freedom," a title that also suggests that the paper will be concerned with the phenomenology rather than the metaphysics of free choice. However, Grenberg begins from the arguably metaphysical problem about how intelligible character is supposed to manifest itself in empirical or phenomenal character. I have argued that Kant addresses this problem in the "Critical Elucidation of the Analytic of Practical Reason" in the second Critique with his argument that the entire phenomenal character of the agent, not just what we call reason at the empirical level, is that manifestation, and thus the feeling of respect and any other modifications of feeling involved in action must play this role (Guyer 1993, pp. 361-5). Grenberg instead looks for a "schematization" of intelligible character (115). This makes me uneasy, because although Kant does call empirical character the "sensible schema" of intelligible character in the first Critique (A 553/B 581), and also speaks of the free play of understanding and imagination in aesthetic experience as a kind of schematization in §35 of the third Critique, he never precisely defines any sense of schematization except that of concepts by temporal schemata, so these other suggestions remain vague. In any case, Grenberg ends up arguing that it is our consciousness of the moral law that is the "phenomenal face" of our noumenal freedom (127-8), which is nothing but a restatement of the "fact of reason" argument of the Analytic of the second Critique, and entirely omits the point of the "Critical Elucidation" that it is the whole of the character of the agent, feelings and all, that must be the empirical manifestation of her intelligible character. In other words, her conclusion is diametrically opposed to Frierson's, though neither paper engages the other.

In "Something to Love: Kant and the Faith of Reason," David Sussman also comes to the conclusion, in agreement with Frierson but contrary to Grenberg, although again the papers do not refer to each other, that

it is a feature of human agency that our choices must be understood not just episodically, but as parts of our ongoing careers as agents who must exist and make sense of themselves over time. . . . the true nature of our overall commitments cannot be pieced together from the qualities of our particular choices taken severally (147).

Sussman gets to this conclusion through the recognition that for Kant "reason does not immediately determine our choices in the act of judgment, but instead motivates us by creating new inclinations in us by means of a special kind of representation" (137), with which I agree, though I find the last bit vague.  But he then adds the claim that, for Kant, "for each life, there can only be one such ultimate maxim": "Our basic disposition is not something that we choose at one point in time, only to revise it or reject it at some other point" (145), and therefore our "ongoing careers as agents" and the associated inclinations must always manifest such a single choice. This seems to me to compound Sussman's error in his earlier work (like Lipscomb's) of supposing that Kant has an a priori argument for the necessity and universality of radical evil with a version of Schopenhauer's error in The Basis of Morality (e.g., §10, Schopenhauer 2009, p. 173) of inferring that because noumenal choice is (supposedly) timeless and thereby not subject to our usual, spatio-temporal framework for the individuation of actions, it must therefore be single, and thus, one agent, one ultimate choice, for good or evil. But the (supposed) timelessness of noumenal choice does not imply its singularity, only that we cannot individuate it by our normal means and therefore have no theoretical knowledge of how many noumenal choices an individual may make. In fact, Schopenhauer's and Sussman's inference makes nonsense out of Part I of the Religion, for Kant's point is nothing less than that because of the principle that "ought implies can" (which Kant cites no fewer than six times), we must believe on practical grounds that even if we have chosen evil in the (phenomenal) past, we are still free to choose good, i.e., reverse our choice of fundamental maxim. The point of the radicality of evil, that it is a matter of free choice and not just radical inclinations, is precisely that even though we cannot explain in phenomenal terms how this works, we always remain free to convert to good. Then again, and this is a point Kant emphasizes in Part II of the Religion, the human being who has chosen good is always free to backslide. In other words, though of course again we cannot really understand how this works, there is no limit to the number of (noumenally) free choices of fundamental maxim we can make; in Kant's view, the real moral character of a human being is always at risk or up for grabs, never fixed for life. I myself find this one of the deepest insights of Kant's moral philosophy, even though I have no use for the metaphysics of transcendental idealism (in any of its interpretations) by means of which Kant reaches it.

In "Duties, Ends and the Divine Corporation," James Krueger argues against J.B. Schneewind's thesis that for Kant the idea of a secular, political realm of ends ultimately replaced the idea of a "divine corporation," a union of humans under the benign rule of God, as the goal of morality. But his real target is Andrews Reath's distinction (in Reath 1988) between "religious" and "secular" interpretations of the highest good, the former being the idea that the highest good consists in the apportionment of happiness to individuals corresponding to their degree of virtue (something which needs God as judge and executioner) and the latter the idea that the highest good consists in the progress toward greater or greatest virtue and happiness of the entire human race (158, 162). I myself always thought Reath's way of making this distinction was misleading, because although there certainly is a difference between the two conceptions of the highest good, each of which Kant suggests, for Kant both are supposed to require a religious foundation: in Kant's view, it is necessary to believe that God exists in order to believe either that individuals will always receive their just rewards or that human progress toward the collective maximization of virtue and happiness is possible. So I agree with Krueger's criticism of Reath that in Kant's view the supposedly "secular" highest good still needs a "religious" foundation. However, I reject entirely Krueger's view that Kant's solution is that "it is only by postulating the existence of God" as "a being capable of bending the natural order to take into account the requirements of morality, that we can guarantee that moral action is always intelligible," thus that "general happiness is only possible on the condition of a specific kind of divine intervention" (168, emphasis added). This seems to be contrary not only to Kant's conception in the second Critique of the necessity of postulating the divine authorship of both the moral law and the laws of nature precisely so that we can realize that the object of morality can, contrary to initial appearance, be realized without bending the laws of nature, but also to everything that Kant believed from the Universal Natural History of 1755 to the Critique of the Teleological Power of Judgment of 1790. Krueger's position requires us to accept a Kant who believed in the necessity of belief in miracles.

In "Real Repugnance and Belief about Things-in-Themselves: A Problem and Kant's Three Solutions," Andrew Chignell continues an argument he has been making in several other publications that Kant is interested in the real possibility of the ideas of reason, particularly of course the idea of God, not just the logical non-contradictoriness of the concept but the "non-repugnance" or real compatibility of the properties predicated of the idea. This is not a problem without historical provenance: Leibniz thought that the problem with Descartes's ontological proof was that it did not first prove the compatibility of the properties predicated of God, although he also thought that since the properties are all positive perfections, their compatibility is easily proved. Chignell does not mention this historical antecedent for his concern. Instead, his argument is that while real possibility is ordinarily inferred from the pure or empirical intuition of objects by means of the principle "actuality implies possibility," this cannot work in the case of ideas of reason for which we have no corresponding intuitions, so the proof of reality is instead afforded by symbols of the ideas of reason, paradigmatically the aesthetic symbolism of natural beauty and the artistic symbols of the ideas of reason that we find in works of artistic genius. I find it incredible that Kant could have thought that a symbol could prove the real possibility of what it symbolizes; perhaps a natural or artistic symbol of an idea may strengthen our conviction of the reality of the idea, an issue that Chignell separates from the proof of its real possibility, but the very possibility of symbolization presupposes that our conception of that which is to be symbolized is coherent.

In what I found to be one of the best papers in the collection, "Practical Cognition, Intuition, and the Fact of Reason," Patrick Kain explains the fact that Kant talks about practical cognition of our freedom to act in accordance with the moral law but only of the practical postulate of the existence of God by distinguishing between the "ontological ground" of our obligation to fulfill the moral law, namely our own freedom, and the "object of volition under the moral law," the object we are commanded by it to realize, that is, the highest good. His claim is that we cognize freedom as the very ground of our obligation under the moral law but do not cognize the existence of God in the same way, but only as the condition of the possibility of the object of morality (229). I found this distinction illuminating, although I would have liked to have seen Kain consider the further possibility that while we may need to believe that we are actually free in order to try to live up to the moral law, we only have to believe that the highest good and its condition, God, are not impossible in order for it to be rational to attempt to do what morality requires of us -- and then to ask whether we need any conditions at all in order to believe that the highest good is not impossible (which is in a way where Chignell's question leads).

In "Kant's Reidianism: The Role of Common Sense in Kant's Epistemology of Religious Belief," Lee Hardy argues that when it comes to belief in the existence of God Kant was a better common-sense Reidian than Reid himself; Reid accepted traditional arguments for the existence of God, but Kant supposed that ordinary people have a natural disposition to believe in God that really does not need philosophical justification at all, but rather needs philosophical defense only if and when it comes under philosophical attack. This seems to me to fundamentally misconstrue Kant's conception of common sense, which is not that it is a form of instinct instead of reason but that it is a natural form of reason. It also undermines Kant's conception of the "natural dialectic" of reason, as he calls it in the Groundwork, which is that it is precisely reason itself that naturally generates the problems that only the further use of reason can resolve. On Kant's account, no one is immune from the natural dialectic of reason. In other words, there is no such thing as merely bad academic philosophy, from which common sense can be as it were externally defended by better academic philosophy if the need arises; the mistakes of philosophy are just as "natural" as is their correction, so the need for philosophy is endemic to the human condition.

In the penultimate paper of the volume, "Kant on the Hiddenness of God," Eric Watkins finds practical arguments for the unknowableness of God, such as that knowing that God exists and what he wants of us would undermine our own freedom to choose, and finds them wanting in comparison to theoretical arguments for the unknowableness of God, which come down to the claims that "the evidence available to us is insufficient to support the claim that God is perfect, and our concept of God's infinite magnitude is too thin to represent God adequately or to give us content robust enough to identify God on that basis" (290). It seemed to me that Watkins did a lot of work to come to this plausible conclusion.

I found the final paper in the volume, Rachel Zuckert on "Kant's Account of Practical Fanaticism," more interesting, indeed the most interesting paper in the volume. With careful comparison of Kant's ideas about "enthusiasm" (Enthusiasmus) and "fanaticism" (Schwärmerei) to those of Locke and Shaftesbury, Zuckert argues that the danger to morality with which Kant was concerned above all was "the desire for passivity," the view that "one becomes pleasing to God not through moral action, but rather through "(merely passive) inner illumination," the danger that "the mystic detaches himself from his own rational personality, aims precisely at the abdication of agency, even the 'annihilation of his own personality,' in favor of a state of [religious] feeling" (309-10). In other words, what Kant was worried about was Schopenhauer's asceticism and quietism, although Kant could not yet put the point that way and Zuckert does not put the point that way.

I doubt whether Zuckert intended her account of Kant's diagnosis of practical fanaticism as a subtle rejoinder to the apologetic interpretation of Kant promulgated by some of her colleagues in this volume. But the enlistment of Kant in the cause of "reformed epistemology" in the most extreme of the apologetic papers in this volume certainly made me uncomfortable. As I have argued along the way, there are some serious confusions in even some of the less extreme metaphysical and religious versions of Kant in this volume. And I do think the failure of any of the contributors of the volume to seriously develop Karl Ameriks's hint in the first paper that Kant's own normative moral theory itself rests on a kind of perfectionism was a missed opportunity.


Allison, Henry E. (1983, rev. 2004). Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Guyer, Paul (1993). "Duty and Inclination." In Guyer, Kant and the Experience of Freedom. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Pp. 335-93.

Guyer, Paul (2006). Kant. London: Routledge.

Kant, Immanuel (1997). Lectures on Ethics. Edited by Peter Heath and J.B. Schneewind, translated by Peter Heath. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kant, Immanuel (2005). Notes and Fragments. Edited by Paul Guyer, translated by Curtis Bowman, Paul Guyer, and Frederick Rauscher. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kant, Immanuel (2011). Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime and Other Writings. Edited by Patrick Frierson and Paul Guyer. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Korsgaard, Christine M. (2009). Self-Constitution: Agency, Identity, and Integrity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Morgan, Seiriol (2005). "The Missing Formal Proof of Humanity's Radical Evil in Kant's Religion." Philosophical Review 114 (2005): 63-114.

O'Neill, Onora (2003). "Constructivism in Rawls and Kant." In Samuel Freeman, editor, The Cambridge Companion to Rawls. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Pp. 347-67.

Reath, Andrews (1988). "Two Conceptions of the Highest Good in Kant." Journal of the History of Philosophy 26 (1988): 593-619.

Schopenhauer, Arthur (2009). The Two Fundamental Problems of Ethics. Edited and translated by Christopher Janaway. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Sussman, David (2005). "Perversity of the Heart." Philosophical Review 114 (2005): 153-77.