Kant's Observations and Remarks: A Critical Guide

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Susan Meld Shell and Richard Velkley (eds.), Kant's Observations and Remarks: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 286pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521769426.

Reviewed by Brian Chance, University of Tennessee, Knoxville


As Shell and Velkey note in their introduction, a collection on Kant's 1764 Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and the Sublime and his subsequent "remarks" in that text (hereafter Remarks) might seem "anomalous" (p. 1). Yet even a cursory perusal of the essays and the texts for which they serve as a guide reveals that both texts are indispensible to understanding the development of Kant's ethics and anthropology and, moreover, that much can be gained by examining them together.

Still, there is a tension worth noting in the conception of such a volume. As the editors and contributors are all aware, the Remarks are neither a commentary on the Observations, nor even a unified text. Rather, they are a series of notes -- spanning nearly 200 Academy Edition pages -- that Kant made in his personal copy of the Observations, sometimes on the margins of the text and sometimes on the blank pages he had inserted in his copy.[1] The content of the notes does not generally correspond to the pages of the Observations to which they are most proximate, and there is no way to determine their order of composition. Yet it is clear that the Remarks documents important developments in Kant's thought in the year following the publication of the Observations.

There is a case to be made that examining these texts in light of the other adds to our understanding of Kant's philosophy as a whole; indeed, this case is made ably by many of the contributors. But the nature of the texts makes it unlikely such an examination will reveal much about the texts individually that could not be gained by considering them in isolation. It is perhaps for this reason that the contributions that deal most extensively with both the Observations and Remarks address aspects of the development of Kant's philosophy, while those that focus more on the Observations are more effective as guides to that text. There is, however, no essay devoted to the Remarks as a whole, so the sense in which the volume is a guide to them is rather different than the sense in which it is a guide to the Observations. Thus, while there is exposition of many of the views in the Observations, the authors who discuss the Remarks typically guide the reader by identifying portions of them that speak in interesting ways to the views that Kant holds in his published works as opposed to considering the interest or importance of the Remarks themselves.[2] Given the nature of the two texts, this is perhaps the only way that such a collection could be put together, but the difference is nonetheless one that deserves highlighting.

The volume contains an introduction and thirteen essays -- eleven newly commissioned and two (those of Dieter Henrich and Reinhard Brandt) appearing in English for the first time -- and is divided into four sections. It is of course impossible to do justice to the complexity of these articles in so short a space, but in what follows I provide a brief comment on each, with an eye toward the unity of each of the sections and the use the authors make of both the Observations and Remarks.

The first section, "Kant's Ethical Thought: Sources and Stages," begins with an essay by Henrich that traces the development of Kant's ethical views prior to the Observations and highlights the importance of Leibniz, Wolff, and Crusius to their development. Corey W. Dyck then examines the ethical view sketched in section two of the Observations against the background of a host of ethical distinctions found in the works of Baumgarten and Meier. The most important of these distinctions is that between a "chimerical ethics", which posits obligations that are either false or impossible to satisfy, and a "flattering ethics", which restricts our obligations to those that are "sensibly agreeable" (Meier, Philosophische Sittenlehre, §21). Against this background, Dyck argues that Kant's inclusion of sympathy and honor as surrogates to virtue in the Observations is in part an attempt to develop a non-chimerical alternative to the views of Baumgarten and Meier, which Kant, under the influence of Rousseau, subsequently rejects in the Remarks as a merely flattering ethics.

In two closely related essays, Patrick F. Frierson and Paul Guyer each turn our attention to the relationship between the Observations and Remarks and Kant's mature ethics. Frierson identifies two notions of universality in play in these works, arguing that the Observations makes use of a notion of universality that involves objects or ends of volition and that the Remarks records the beginning of a shift to the "deliberative" or "subjective" universality that characterizes Kant's mature ethics. The reasons for this shift, Frierson argues, have to do with familiar Kantian themes -- a rejection of consequentialism, a desire for certainty in morals, and doubts about the motivational efficacy of feelings of sympathy and benevolence -- as well as the British sentimentalists and Rousseau, both of whom Frierson believes articulated a notion of subjective universality similar to Kant's. Guyer focuses on the light the Observations and Remarks can shed on the development of (a) the formulation of the categorical imperative and (b) the grounding of the categorical imperative in the absolute value of human freedom. While neither of these notions is found in the Observations, Guyer uses the Remarks and other contemporaneous notes from Kant's copy of Baumgarten's Introduction to Practical Philosophy and Ethics to argue that both are developed to a significant degree in the period immediately after the publication of the Observations. Despite several strategies suggested in the Remarks and elsewhere, however, Guyer argues that Kant does not have a clear way to connect the value of freedom with the universalizability required by the categorical imperative.

The volume's second section is entitled "Ethics and Aesthetics", although only two of its three essays squarely address both topics. Rudolf A. Makkreel focuses on the feelings of sympathy and honor and argues that while Kant does not grant these feelings the status of genuinely virtuous feelings and motives for action in the Remarks, he is able to rehabilitate both in his later moral philosophy. Chief among Makkreel's targets is Allen Wood's account of the origin of radical evil. His discussion of the Religion and Metaphysics of Morals is more extensive than his discussion of the Observations. Robert Clewis begins with a brief and useful history of the sublime before laying out Kant's version of the distinction between true and false sublimity in the Observations and Remarks. Looking forward to the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Clewis then argues that some pre-critical aesthetic concepts become central to the critical aesthetics (e.g. the pre-critical concept of the terrifying sublime is transformed into the critical concept of the dynamical sublime). But this is not the case for the distinction between the true and false sublime because what Kant wanted to capture under the category of the false sublime is largely taken up in the context of his critical ethics.

Although Alix Cohen largely neglects the Remarks, her essay is in many ways the most interesting in the section. Cohen's focus is on the natural teleology of the Observations and its contrast with the natural teleology of Kant's later works. She claims that instead of describing the ways in which nature is able to bring about moral progress, the natural teleology of the Observations focuses on the ways in which nature "ensures that the human species survives and flourishes independently of its morality, and in particular despite its lack thereof" (p. 144). In making her case for this claim, Cohen considers the various kinds of feelings discussed in the first two sections of the Observations and their relation to virtue. She also extends her account to incorporate Kant's discussion of temperaments (choleric, sanguine, melancholic, and phlegmatic) as well as his discussion of gender in section three of the Observations and, to a limited extent, his discussion of nations and races in section four.

The third section, "Education, Politics, and National Character," contains three essays, one devoted to each of the section's topics. Felicitas Munzel examines Kant's changing attitude toward human traits, particularly self-interest, from the composition of the Observations and Remarks to the critical works. She attempts to explain why Kant abandons his initially ambivalent attitude toward many of them (e.g., his insistence that honor and the adopted virtues lead to what he will later call actions in conformity with morality) for the decidedly negative view espoused in the critical works. Munzel locates one motive for this change in Kant's increasing interest in eighteenth-century debates on pedagogy. She points, in particular, in his public involvement in the 1770's with the Philanthropinismus movement, during the course of which he came to believe that a moral principle, not self interest, is "primarily definitive of human rational nature" and, hence, should be the starting point of pedagogical discourse (p. 177).

Brandt's essay is unique in that it focuses primarily on the Remarks and, indeed, on a small set of them. Brandt reads the Remarks as a "laboratory of the future," where Kant is able to experiment with ideas that he did not dared make public (p. 197). In the sections he considers, he finds Kant arguing against the feudal order and the conception of property that supports it. Brandt sees Kant developing the beginning of an alternative account of property that is Neostoic in nature and, in particular, draws liberally from the Stoic doctrine of oikeiosis. Finally, Robert Louden explores the relationship between Kant's much-maligned comments on national character and his early lectures on anthropology and physical geography. His efforts on the latter front should be particularly welcome given the recent publication of the first complete English translation of Rink's edition of Kant's Physical Geography in the Cambridge Kant series and the recent interdisciplinary collection on Kant's geography, Reading Kant's Geography, published by SUNY Press.

The essays in the final section, "Science and History", deal with both topics in interesting ways. John Zammito and Karl Ameriks both focus on the influence of Rousseau on Kant and, in particular, this influence as it is recorded in the Remarks. Zammito focuses on science in the broad sense of Wissenschaft; Ameriks looks at the ways Kant's conception of history and the vocation (Bestimmung) of man changed in the 1760's under the influence of Rousseau. The section is something of a procrustean bed for Peter Fenves, who identifies similarities between the Observations and Kierkegaard's Either/Or. Fenves subsequently uses the similarities to motivate an analysis of the first two paragraphs of the Observations.

There is much to recommend this volume, especially for those interested in the intertwining themes of the development of Kant's ethics and anthropology on the one hand and the influence of Rousseau on the other. As should be clear, however, the lion's share of the volume is devoted to the first and second sections of the Observations and passages from the Remarks relevant to the themes of those sections. Indeed, of the thirteen essays, only two -- Cohen's and Louden's -- deal directly with the third and fourth sections of the Observations, which contain Kant's notorious views on gender, national character, and race; even these essays address the topic of race only obliquely.

This omission is unfortunate, not only because of the growing interest in Kant's views on race but also because an essay on the development of these views from the Observations to Kant's later works on race in the last three decades of the eighteenth century would have fit well with many of the others in the volume. Another cost of focusing attention on the first two sections of the Observations is that there is no essay devoted primarily to Kant's views on gender. This too is unfortunate, not only for the reasons noted above in the case of race but also because of the sheer number of passages in the Remarks devoted to gender. Lastly, there is no essay about Kant's views on aspects of natural science, views found in the Remarks. Although his discussions are typically brief and do not correspond to material in the Observations, they concern themes (e.g. magnetism, ether, force, and fire) that occupied Kant prior to 1764 and would continue to occupy him throughout his career. An essay on those views on natural science and their development would have fit nicely into the volume.

[1] This was a general practice of Kant's and does not suggest any particular purpose or importance placed on the Observations themselves.

[2] Brandt's essay is the exception.