Kant's Political Theory: Interpretations and Applications

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Elisabeth Ellis (ed.), Kant's Political TheoryInterpretations and Applications, Penn State University Press, 2012, 256pp., $64.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271053776.

Reviewed by Helga Varden, University of Illinois, Urbana-Champaign


Kant's legal-political philosophy has a peculiar interpretive history even by Kantian standards. Not only did it take extraordinarily long to receive much attention by the scholarship at all, but Kantian inspired political theories received much more attention than did Kant's own. For example, two of the most influential political theories of the last few decades are those of Habermas and Rawls -- two Kantian positions that were initially developed without taking Kant's own legal and political writings as their starting point. Although Habermas has increasingly become preoccupied with and inspired by Kant's legal-political philosophy -- and especially Kant's main writing on the issue, the Doctrine of Right in The Metaphysics of Morals -- the same was never true of Rawls. Rawls was clearly inspired by some of Kant's shorter, political essays, primarily in his thinking about global justice in The Law of Peoples, but most of the Kantian ideas developed as part of his theory of "justice as fairness" utilize core ideas in Kant's ethical writings, including some of those captured by the categorical imperative.

One reason for this delay of scholarship is presumably the fact that Kant's main work on the issue -- the Doctrine of Right -- is written in a somewhat extreme form of Kantianese (technical Kant vocabulary) that is both difficult to understand and often presupposes an interpretation of key ideas in Kant's overall philosophical project. Furthermore, according to Kant himself the ideas presented are less worked out than he would have liked. (It was published towards the end of his life when he had less time to devote to polishing it.) In contrast, many of his shorter, political essays are among the most moving, well written, and most accessible of any of Kant's writings. Another reason why his political philosophy received little engagement is simply the fact that in the Doctrine of Right (as well as in the corresponding lecture notes written by his students) we find some of those statements seemingly presenting Kant as a stern absolutist with little or no patience for the poor and who is more than willing to use the whip to uphold his sexist and homophobic prejudices. In any case, whatever the reason for the delay, things have changed dramatically over the last three decades or so, and today there is little doubt that Kant's legal-political philosophy, including the Doctrine of Right, has come into its own.

Looking more closely at the rapidly growing secondary literature on Kant's legal-political philosophy reveals a distinction between two common trends regarding how it is engaged. On the one hand, a significant number of interpretations focus primarily on Kant's political writings (even if they also secondarily draw on other Kant texts). These interpretations typically emphasize the Doctrine of Right with an aim of identifying or developing a coherent overall interpretation of the position. On the other hand, a significant number of interpretations explore the relationship between Kant's legal-political writings and the historical period in which they were written or with regard to other aspects of his philosophy, including his theoretical, historical, educational, anthropological, and aesthetic writings. Since the aim of Elisabeth Ellis' anthology is to "introduce Kant's political thought to a new generation of readers and to demonstrate the fruitfulness and vibrancy of a broadly Kantian approach to political philosophy" (3), it is natural that the anthology includes representatives from both interpretive streams. There's something for everyone, even if everything is not there and if everything that is there is not for everyone.

Kant's Political Theory consists of nine articles as well as one of the currently richest bibliographies on Kant's legal-political thought. The authors are a mix between well-established scholars in the field and newer voices. They include philosophers, historians and political scientists. Moreover, applying the distinction between the two kinds of writings we commonly find in the secondary literature on Kant's legal-political thought yields two groups of papers. Five of the papers (by Onora O'Neill, Arthur Ripstein, Thomas W. Pogge, Louis-Philippe Hodgson, Robert S. Taylor) explore Kant's political thought by primarily focusing on the Doctrine of Right and the political essays. The remaining four papers (by Michaele Ferguson, Ian Hunter, Mika LaVaque-Manty, and John Christian Laursen) explore aspects of Kant's political thought by looking to some of his other writings and/or the historical setting of his academic life.

Of the papers in the first group, the first two -- by O'Neill and Ripstein -- seek to identify core elements in the basic philosophical structure of Kant's theory and to use them to situate Kant's theory in relation to the historical canon. The main idea suggested by O'Neill in "Kant and the Social Contract Tradition" is that rather than using the prominent social contract ideas of hypothetical or actual (explicit or implicit) consent to understand Kant's basic claim that just impositions on persons' exercise of their external freedom can be consented to by these persons whose freedom is so constrained, we should use a modal notion of consent, meaning that such consent must be possible (36). The implication of this, O'Neill suggests, is that if we want to call Kant a social contract theorist, we should be aware that "he is a peculiar one." (27) O'Neill ends by saying that the main reason why we need justice and the state is that human beings not only have to interact, but have an irreducible "unsociable" aspect (39) and are not "reliably altruistic" (37).

Despite the many agreements between O'Neill's and Ripstein's articles, it is clear that challenging this very last idea -- that Kant affirmed the historically prominent idea that justice fundamentally remedies human beings' typical tendency not to act virtuously (insufficiently altruistically) -- motivates a great deal of Ripstein's interpretation in "Kant and the Circumstances of Justice." Ripstein argues that even if we assume away our "crooked timber," or our typical tendencies to act in ignorant, biased, selfish, or vicious ways, we still need justice. And to fully establish justice, we need states (the rule of law). Against much Kant interpretation (including the majority of the other articles in the anthology) and other prominent theories of justice, such as those we find in Hobbes, Locke, and Hume, Ripstein defends the claim that for Kant "neither justice nor the law is remedial." (44) The first part of Ripstein's paper aims to demonstrate that this basic assumption fundamentally informs Kant's proposal that establishing the state is constitutive of realizing justice, including why the pre-state condition or the state of nature, at best, is "devoid" of justice. (Because this "remedial/non-remedial" assumption is crucial for how one tries to make sense of Kant's writings, I indicate below which conception of justice and the state the other articles presuppose, if one is presupposed.) In the second part of the paper, Ripstein shows that though justice requires a state (the rule of law) anyone who manages to establish a monopoly on coercion (rule-governed violence) does not thereby also establish a minimally just state. Therefore, barbaric regimes like Nazi-Germany cannot issue political obligations on those subject to its force.

In the third article, "Is Kant's Rechtslehre a 'Comprehensive Liberalism'?" Pogge utilizes Rawls's influential distinction between "freestanding, political conceptions of justice" and "comprehensive doctrines" to explore a particularly puzzling feature of Kant's Doctrine of Right, namely the way in which justice and the law are seen as restricted to so-called "external" freedom. Rawls' distinction is utilized to explain aspects of the way in which Kant separates ethics ("internal" freedom) from justice or right ("external" freedom). Pogge suggests that Kant's conception of justice is freestanding and political in the Rawlsian sense. Consequently like Rawls's theory of "justice as fairness," Kant's legal-political theory is compatible with -- can fit as a "module" into -- many very different comprehensive doctrines and not only Kant's own (as Rawls thought). In addition to making this larger point, Pogge engages some of the more specific aspects of Kant's argument for the establishment of the state, including expressing some worries that Kant's justification of the state does not succeed as an "a priori" (or "non-remedial") argument, but only as the weaker "empirical" ("remedial") argument. (86f) This and other arguments in this paper can be fruitfully engaged by reading it along with the contributions by O'Neill, Ripstein, and Hodgson (next chapter), all of which were written subsequent to Pogge's contribution, which was a groundbreaking piece (originally published in 1998).

In "Realizing External Freedom: The Kantian Argument for a World State," Hodgson engages another central debate in the literature, namely issues concerning global justice. In short, Hodgson utilizes arguments structurally similar to the ("non-remedial") ones Ripstein presents for the domestic case in order to justify the claim that Kant does and Kantians should support the establishment of a world state. The world state is viewed as a legal-political framework with legislative, judiciary, and executive powers restricted to interactions between states and between states and aliens. Within the existing secondary literature, the position Hodgson defends is on one extreme, where the other extreme maintains that Kant rejects the permanent establishment of any kind of a global public authority with coercive powers. Interestingly, as the relevant secondary literature shows, one can end up on either extreme -- and anywhere in between -- regardless of whether one interprets Kant and the Kantian project as "remedial" or "non-remedial." Hodgson's paper is a fine illustration of how one can end up firmly within the world state camp by means of non-remedial arguments.

The four papers already described focus primarily on Kant's Doctrine of Right. In contrast, Taylor explores Kant's thought by making one of Kant's political essays his primary focus. "The Progress of Absolutism in Kant's Essay 'What is Enlightenment?'" explains how Kant's "Enlightenment" essay contributes to the specific debate in his time of how to understand the concept of enlightenment. Taylor also takes us through some of the key arguments in the "Enlightenment" essay, such as Kant's somewhat peculiar distinction between private and public uses of reason. He then argues that understanding Kant's contribution involves seeing how Kant conceived of the possible, historical or developmental transitions from an absolute monarch to an enlightened republic "in a manner wholly consistent with both justice and the short-run interests of the regent himself." (148) To strengthen his case, Taylor draws on several of Kant's other political essays as well as Kant's treatment of historical religions and the Doctrine of Right. Although many of the details of Taylor's argument can be disputed, it is not hard to see that an interpretation along this line is relatively easily made compatible with much of what is claimed in the previous four essays (even with their differences on whether to accept the remedial or non-remedial assumption).

Looking at the first set of five papers together, there is little doubt that they give a good starting point for engaging much of the literature surrounding many of the larger interpretive questions in Kant scholarship. There are a few larger questions that are not addressed by any of the papers, such as discussions of Kant's conceptions of domestic public right, freedom of speech, and punishment, but the papers as a whole yield a solid beginning for new readers to engage many classical systematic issues in relation to Kant's legal-political theory. A second, possible drawback (the anthology is entitled Kant's Political Theory: Interpretations and Applications) is that most of the classical or common applied topics in legal-political philosophy, such as distributive justice (poverty), children's rights, abortion, animals' rights, health care rights, environmental protection etc., are not addressed by these (or the remaining) papers.

Let us turn now to the second set of papers, which are less attentive to a technical exploration of Kant's legal-political writings as such, and instead are more focused on other works or historical facts that may have a bearing on how we consider certain aspects of Kant's legal-political thought. Two of these papers, like Taylor's, consider Kant's theory of justice in relation to issues of history and historical progress. But their approaches are quite different. Ferguson's "Unsocial Sociability: Perpetual Antagonism in Kant's Political Thought" argues that in order to understand Kant's core notion of "unsocial sociability," including what we find in the essay "The Idea for Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose," we must look not only to Kant the "moral philosopher," but also to Kant the "phenomenologist" (152). As we do, we must notice the distinction and tension in a way that Kant himself and Kantians do not (153). The problem is that Kant and Kantians conflate human nature (viewed as things about us that pose problems for our morality or cause "moral failure") and the human condition (the morally neutral plurality of humankind) when they consider antagonism's role in human societies and their development (159f). Consequently, Kant typically sees antagonism from the point of view of moral philosophy, according to which antagonism should be overcome. Hence Kant asserts that a united will provides a means for overcoming or, to use Ripstein's language, "remedying" antagonisms (163). Similarly, contemporary Kantian approaches, like those of Rawls and Habermas, mistakenly search for the construction of some procedures, "rational will formation," or "cosmopolitan institutions that could guarantee peaceful and just relations around the globe." (153)

In contrast, Ferguson argues that if we see antagonism from the point of view of phenomenology, we can appreciate how the pursuit of a cosmopolitan future -- perpetual peace -- "both requires and is undermined by antagonism." (164) For example, she argues that even though antagonism as a result of moral failure (human nature) makes peace difficult, antagonism as a result of the plurality constitutive of the human condition (our unsocial sociability) drives much of human progress, including our recognition of the need for the rule of law and public institutions at both the domestic and global levels (155f). As we have seen above, some of the prominent interpretations of Kant today challenge the remedial interpretation of Kant's justification of the need for justice and the state. If they are correct in maintaining that Kant provides both remedial and non-remedial justifications for justice and the state, then, correspondingly, Kant may not have been confused about this, and Ferguson's interpretation may be closer to getting Kant right on "unsocial sociability" than she thinks.

Contrary to Ferguson who thinks that much can be learned if we merely untangle various confusions found in Kant's and Kantian legal-political thinking, Hunter's "Kant's Political Thought in the Prussian Enlightenment" is much more ambitious. He seeks to uncover the true structure of Kant's legal-political philosophy -- a structure that is invisible if one reads only Kant's legal-political and moral writings. Consequently, it is unappreciated by currently prominent Kant scholars. Hunter's first task is to inform contemporary Kantians of "the complex cultural-political terrain" Kant was operating in -- a terrain that is "largely terra incognita in studies of Kant's moral philosophy" (175f). He aims to show that Kant's political and religious writings, despite appearances, seek to defend Kant's ideal of the intellectual as "the Protestant German university metaphysician" (185) against various competing moral-religious programs. Second, he employs this historical knowledge to uncover Kant's real purpose in the Doctrine of Right, which he summarizes in the following way:

Kant's Rechtslehre is thus based on the metaphysical anthropology of man the self-determining pure intelligence that he elaborated in his metaphysics of morals. In fact Kant's political and legal doctrine is formed on the basis of the extraordinary conception that right or justice originates when this pure intelligence, existing outside space and time, seeks to exercise its freedom 'externally' by occupying the global surface of the earth. (182)

There is almost no end to the interpretive puzzles and controversies raised by this statement (and statements of its kind throughout the paper), some of which readers may discern from consulting the other papers in the volume. That this statement and many other interpretive claims throughout the paper are textually implausible gives Hunter little pause, however, since what Kant appears to be saying is not so important. To understand what Kant really means in his legal-political writings, we need to look elsewhere. In particular, we need to appreciate a particular (also controversial) interpretation of Kant's Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, the plausibility of which is seen as stemming from a particular interpretation of various historical facts that influenced Kant deeply (including in ways Kant himself wasn't aware).

LaVaque-Manty's "Kant on Education" explores aspects of Kant's view of education. It starts by explaining how Kant was particularly influenced and supportive of the Philanthropinen education movement (founded by Johann Bernhard Basedow) before moving on to the way in which Kant's conception of education complements his moral philosophy -- both his ethics and his legal-political philosophy. Of particular importance, LaVaque-Manty points out, is the emphasis Kant puts on children being treated as children whose aim is to learn to master their freedom -- both their internal and their external (including embodied) freedom. LaVaque-Manty does not explore whether or how this impacts the issue of children's rights or public law issues concerning education, but clearly it points to many concerns such an account will consider.

The final paper, Laursen's "Kant, Freedom of the Press, and Book Piracy" primarily focuses on Kant's argument for book piracy, though at the very end it touches upon the question of freedom of the press. Laursen begins by arguing that Kant's small section on book piracy in the Doctrine of Right ("What is a Book?") contains arguments he had presented in an essay in Berlinische Monatsschrift a decade earlier -- an essay aimed at refuting his contemporary, Martin Ehler. According to Ehler, book piracy should be outlawed because it involves stealing the author's thoughts or ideas, whereas Kant proposes that piracy should be outlawed because it involves "the transaction of business in the name of another without his consent." (230) Laursen's paper is particularly useful for learning about the historical setting in which Kant was formulating his piracy arguments.

To me, a general drawback of these last four papers is that they do not reveal an intimate familiarity with the kinds of positions defended in the first five papers and hence that they do not try to draw any connections to them. Therefore they are unconnected from currently prominent interpretations of Kant's Doctrine of Right and his legal-political essays. At least this seems to be the reason why these last four papers do not utilize the kinds of interpretations found in the first five papers as they develop their own. Then again, this disconnect is prominent in the literature, so perhaps Ellis is quite right in making this selection in her effort to represent the current literature accurately. In sum, then, although the selection of some of the papers puzzles me somewhat and, as mentioned above, although there are some types of papers I believe the anthology would have benefitted from including, in my view it certainly succeeds in its aim of providing new readers with a good starting point for approaching the literature surrounding Kant's legal-political thought. These new readers should be fairly well versed in legal-political philosophy beforehand, but to such readers the anthology provides a very good sense of the current variety of approaches to Kant's theory of justice.