Kant's Questions: What is the Human Being?

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Patrick R. Frierson, Kant's Questions: What is the Human Being?, Routledge, 2013, 322pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415558457.

Reviewed by Tim Jankowiak, Towson University


This is a book about Kant's theory of human nature -- his "anthropology" -- and about the legacy of this theory in the 20th century. The first half or so gives a detailed account of Kant's multi-faceted anthropology, discussing the human being as cognizer, as agent, and as conditioned by history and culture. This first part is especially interesting because Patrick Frierson gives a systematic reconstruction of many of the lesser-known, "empirical" elements of Kant's account of human nature, thus supplementing and complementing the better-known, "transcendental" elements. The second half puts Kant in conversation with later theorists of human nature. Influential voices from the natural sciences (e.g., Darwin, Richard Dawkins, and Steven Pinker), the human sciences (e.g., Marx, Freud, Geertz, and Ruth Benedict), and diverse areas of philosophy (e.g., Nietzsche, Heidegger, Sartre, Foucault, Moore, Kuhn, Korsgaard, and MacIntyre) are represented. Frierson's goal is to present these diverse answers to Kant's question in their own terms, but also to see how Kant's own answers stack up against the contemporary ones.

Picking up a book on Kant's anthropology, readers familiar with Kant's published works will immediately think of Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1791). However, pragmatic anthropology is but one small part of Kant's full theory of human nature. Frierson argues that, for Kant, "the question ['What is the human being?'] was simply equivalent to philosophy as such" (138). Answers to Kant's better known questions -- What can I know? What should I do? What may I hope? -- together make up the answer to the question, "What is the human being?". The book's scope is accordingly very wide.

Frierson begins by distinguishing between Kant's "transcendental anthropology" and his "empirical anthropology." The former is what is usually referred to as Kant's "critical" philosophy. It is the a priori theory of the universal and essential features of the human mind and human agent as Kant laid it out in the three "Critiques" (and in other important works from the 1780s). Chapter 1 summarizes Kant's transcendental anthropology, and it is an impressively clear and concise overview of the important elements of the critical philosophy. This chapter could easily serve as a standalone introduction to the most influential components of Kant's philosophy.

Chapters 2-5 address various aspects of Kant's less familiar empirical anthropology. These chapters will probably be the book's most interesting parts for Kant scholars because Frierson appeals to a wide range of texts not found on the average Kant scholar's reading list. Like transcendental anthropology, empirical anthropology attempts to explain the human being as knower and doer, but the latter does so through inquiry into the contingencies of human psychology, moral character, and cultural and historical location. For instance, Chapter 2 contains a lengthy discussion of Kant's empirical theory of action and motivation, explaining the contributions of instinct and character in determining the predispositions at the basis of human action. In his purely philosophical writings, Kant tells us that humans, as a part of nature, are subject to deterministic natural laws, so it is interesting to see that Kant also has an empirical theory of these laws worked out in some detail. Other highlights from these chapters are the discussions of radical evil and human history (Chapter 3), Kant's theories of gender and race (Chapter 4), and the "pragmatic" uses of anthropological knowledge (Chapter 5).

The most interesting parts of these chapters have to do with the relation -- sometimes consonant, sometimes dissonant -- between Kant's transcendental anthropology and his empirical anthropology. Some examples: 1) Kant's empirical psychological theory of instinct and character presents human choice as at the mercy of deterministic causal forces, but, as is well-known, such determinism is a necessary part of nature and is consistent with the possibility of transcendental freedom lying outside the natural realm. Although culture, education, our parents, etc. determine our characters, we can still be held responsible for our characters from the transcendental perspective. 2) According to Kant's transcendental anthropology, freedom is essential to humanity, but his theory of the beginnings of humanity explains how this freedom had to be discovered at a concrete moment in history (when we realized that we don't have to act on instinct) before this capacity could begin to be developed and cultivated. 3) Kant's empirical observation that human beings are universally evil (since we all freely subordinate the moral law to sensuous self-love at least some of the time) is consistent with the "moral hope" (80) from Kant's transcendental anthropology that we might be able to one day freely overcome our evil nature.

Perhaps the most interesting conflict between transcendental and empirical anthropology appears in Chapter 4's discussion of Kant's theories of gender and race. For those of us who choose to devote significant parts of our careers to studying Kant's philosophy, there is a strong temptation simply to ignore the sexist and racist elements in Kant's writings (we know they're out there but we don't go out of our way to read them very often). Kant says that women are not capable of true virtue because they cannot act from principles. And he says that black skin is sufficient proof of stupidity. Frierson bravely addresses these embarrassing aspects of Kant's writings head-on. The problem isn't simply that Kant is empirically wrong on these matters (although he is surely that). It's that he fails to recognize that his transcendental claims about the universality of human capacities for cognition and moral freedom are straightforwardly inconsistent with his empirical claims about the cognitive and moral capacities of women and non-white races. This is a vivid example of something commonly criticized about the Enlightenment, viz., the tendency to celebrate the universality of the capacity for reason in humans, but only so long as 'humans' refers to white, European males. That being said, Frierson also avoids the temptation to apologize for Kant by appeal to his time and place. Kant cannot be excused by the prejudices of his day because he had access to discussions of gender and race that were much less sexist and racist than his own (including one by his own student, Herder).

If I have one criticism of Part 1, it is the lack of discussion of Kant's own sources in the development of his empirical anthropology (the influences on his transcendental theory are already thoroughly documented in the literature). Aside from a few references to well-known influences (such as Rousseau) and Kant's access to travelogues, we don't hear much about what Kant appealed to as he complied his empirical anthropology over the course of his career. Surely Kant did not develop his theory whole cloth simply from introspection and observation of the people of Königsberg, so it would have been good to hear more about the writers and theories that were most influential on Kant's thinking. Along similar lines, it would have been good to hear more about the relation between Kant's theory and other anthropologies from the ongoing Enlightenment, of which Kant was self-consciously a contributor.

Part 2 is a single-chapter interlude about several theories of human nature from the 19th century. Frierson focuses on the dialectical idealism and materialism of Hegel and Marx (respectively), Darwin's naturalism, Nietzsche's anti-universalist moral theory, and Freud's account of motivation based in his theory of the unconscious. Although these discussions are interesting and make for good reading, they are each too brief to count as more than quick overviews, and the brief contrasts with Kant (usually only a paragraph or two at time) only skim the surface.

Frierson turns to 20th century accounts of human nature in the final 4 chapters (Part 3). He addresses scientific naturalism (Chapter 7), historicism and human diversity (Chapter 6), existentialism (Chapter 9), and theories of normativity (Chapter 10). He manages to bring into focus a diverse range of contemporary (or nearly contemporary) perspectives on the question of human nature. However, this part sometimes seems to suffer an identity crisis. It isn't always clear whether the primary goal is to present the contemporary views on their own terms, to trace the legacy and influence of Kant's theories through the 20th century, or to "save" Kant's theory by showing how it (or parts of it at least) are consistent with later developments. To some extent it's certainly all of the above, but some of the discussions are more successful than others.

The chapter on scientific naturalism addresses the threats posed by an evolutionary biological fatalism (we're at the mercy of our genes and altruism is an illusion) and a "situationist" psychological fatalism (our actions are determined primarily by social context and free will is an illusion). These are familiar problems that have been addressed extensively in both academic and popular literature, and Frierson does a good job laying out some of the most important theoretical and experimental results that provoke the familiar discussions and debates. But Kant's place in the discussion is not always a natural one. In a few places Frierson attempts to show that something like Kant's empirical psychology lives on in contemporary psychology, but this sometimes requires looking at things from a distance while squinting. For instance, with respect to Amos Tversky and Daniel Kahneman's "heuristics and biases" research program, he writes,

Of course, the specific principles Kant lays out are different from those discovered recently, but the overall structure of Kant's account -- supplementing a logic of ideal thought-processes with detailed empirical studies of systematic divergences from those ideals -- is consistent with contemporary developments. (189)

Fair enough, but Kant was certainly not the first to point out systematic cognitive biases in humans, and the specific details are what matter most in a lot of this research. (It's also debatable whether Kant can be said to have conducted "detailed empirical studies.")

The question regarding free will (and any moral theory that depends on it) is more fruitful, but once again it's not always clear whether the primary goal is to save Kant from contemporary theory or to use Kant in contemporary theorizing. If the goal is to save Kant, then sure, we can appeal to the possible distinction between empirical determinism and transcendental indeterminism so that freedom in transcendental idealism is not undermined. But if the goal is to use Kant to save freedom, then readers today are going to want to place their bets on something more than transcendental idealism. In Frierson's defense, he doesn't rest his case on a metaphysical distinction between the natural realm and a non-spatiotemporal, noumenal realm (which would surely be off-putting to most contemporary readers). Instead, he defends a perspectivism (à la Christine Korsgaard and Onora O'Neill) according to which the scientific perspective on reality is only one perspective, and an incomplete one; the ethical perspective, which sees humans as free, is an equally important and equally legitimate perspective. While this perspectivism is surely Kantian (as in "Kant-inspired"), it is probably not the view of the historical Kant.

Chapter 8 ("Historicism and Human Diversity") and Chapter 9 ("Existentialism") discuss possible Kantian responses to various forms of relativism. Kant's theory of cognition describes a universal and transhistorical structure of the mind. His ethical theory describes a universal and transhistorical moral law. In the 20th century, Einstein and the quantum theorists showed that the flat space-time and strict determinism that Kant took to be necessary forms of the mind and the world were no more than historically contingent Kuhnian "paradigms"; Foucault's "genealogical" investigations suggested that seemingly necessary epistemological forms merely reflect historically contingent power structures; cultural anthropologists showed a wide variety of human value systems that were often quite distant from those familiar in the west since the Enlightenment; and the existentialists argued that taking seriously the human capacity for freedom required rejecting the very notion of a universal ethical system. Frierson outlines different possible avenues that Kantian responses to these relativisms could take. These range from a strict, dogmatic anti-relativism, to varying degrees of partial concessions and modifications of Kant's universalism. For instance, when the question has to do with how a Kantian should evaluate a culture that values aggression, violence, cheating, and in general the motto that "might makes right," one possible response is simply to insist that their value system is wrong, and insofar as they act in accordance with it, they are displaying the radical evil that Kant thinks is intrinsic to all humans to one degree or another. In a completely different vein, when the question has to do with how a Kantian should respond to the indeterminism of quantum mechanics, one can give up strict determinism, but retain the Kantian claim that all events must still follow other events in accordance with rules (even if they are merely probabilistic rules instead of deterministic ones).

One of the most fruitful discussions from the later part of the book is the conversation between Kant and the existentialists (Frierson focuses primarily on Heidegger and Sartre). Kant had argued that to be free and to act in accordance with the autonomously self-imposed moral law are one and the same. While the existentialists approved the emphasis on an agent being the source of her own principles of action, they thought that a "freedom" that led to everyone acting according to the same rules could not be true freedom. We are radically free, they said, and thus we are free to affirm any value system whatsoever, whether it conformed to the categorical imperative or not. Furthermore, they complained that Kant's account of human choice was far too simplistic: one either subordinates self-love to the moral law, or vice versa. Human freedom, however, has to do with much more than just morality. It also determines whom we form relationships with, the careers we choose, the tastes we cultivate, our hobbies, how we seek pleasure, etc. In restricting his account of freedom to a rational affirmation of the moral law, Kant has left out a significant chunk of the human experience. These choices cannot (and should not) be determined by a slavish obedience to rules. Frierson makes the case that these existential considerations should be incorporated into a Kantian worldview. But he also insists that, in the end, Kant is right to prioritize the free affirmation of the moral law above other uses of freedom:

As important as it might seem -- and really be -- to choose the right partner(s) in love, the right career(s), and the right balance of work, deep relationships, and raw pleasures, these choices are less important than choices about whether to do what is right or to forgo moral requirements for other ends. (248)

Frierson's book attempts do many things, and it does most of them very well. While dedicated Kant scholars might be primarily interested only in Chapters 2-5, the general reading public interested in the history of ideas will find the entire volume to contain engaging, lucid, and wide-ranging discussions of diverse perspectives on the human condition.