Kant's Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason: A Commentary

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James J. DiCenso, Kant's Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason: A Commentary, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 269pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107009349.

Reviewed by Benjamin J. Bruxvoort Lipscomb, Houghton College


James J. DiCenso's new book is, the jacket notes, "the first complete English-language commentary" on Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (henceforth, Religion). As one would expect, it follows the formal conventions of its genre. The book begins with a helpful introduction, treating historical background, relevant aspects of Kant's other writings, and DiCenso's interpretive assumptions and methodology. After that, the book consists of five chapters, one on Kant's Prefaces to the first and revised editions, and one each on the four Parts into which Religion is divided. Within each chapter, DiCenso follows the order of topics in Kant's text, with an admirable commitment to extensive quotation (sometimes revising the di Giovanni translation), rather than paraphrase.[1]

Religion is one of Kant's major works, and especially given the greatly increased attention to Kant's philosophy of religion in the past couple of decades[2], it might seem surprising that it has taken this long for an Anglophone scholar to produce a commentary. But the increased attention to Religion has been accompanied by controversy over how religious a thinker Kant is, and in what sense. Some recent interpreters Religion (and of Kant's Critical thought, generally) have emphasized affinities between Kant's thought and the Christian theological tradition to which he frequently alludes -- not to the point of supposing Kant a Christian, but certainly taking quite straightforwardly his affirmations of the existence of God and certain of God's attributes. Others have concluded -- from what Kant says about the limits of human knowledge, about the dangers of overstepping them, and about particular manifestations of such dogmatism -- that he is an essentially secular thinker, hostile especially to any sort of supersensible ontology.[3] This interpretive conflict, perhaps, has made it difficult for anyone to produce the kind of dispassionate work, to be recommended as a guide to and by all, that one associates with the genre of commentary.

DiCenso has not done it either. DiCenso's commentary rather exhibits why (on my conjecture) we have not yet had a complete English-language commentary: there is too little consensus to support one. Any commentary on this work, at this date, must be controversial -- not merely in the inevitable sense that it must be perspectival, but in the sense that it must take a stand against a significant portion of current scholarship. DiCenso sides with secularizing readers of Kant against theologizing readers, in ways that make this commentary read at times more like a sustained argument than a traditional commentary.[4] Indeed, DiCenso elaborates and defends his secularizing take in ways that advance the scholarly discussion. But he is so polemically committed to his standpoint that he does not make intelligible to readers, as an ideal commentator would, the grounds of the controversy surrounding the text and Kant's ethico-religious thought generally. A better subtitle might have been, "a reading".

DiCenso is committed to a holistic interpretive approach that sees Religion as thoroughly consistent with, indeed "follow[ing] directly from", the rest of Kant's Critical corpus. This is important, he remarks, because Religion is a difficult text, easy to misconstrue (in a theologizing direction): "Because Kant's project brings traditional forms of religious discourse . . . into a discussion of ethics and evil, it is quite possible to misconstrue the manner in which these references are used." (p. 22)

DiCenso takes as controlling for his reading of Religion two passages in earlier Critical works: Kant's discussion of the Ideal of Pure Reason in the Dialectic of the Critique of Pure Reason, and his discussion of symbolism in the Critique of the Power of Judgment. In Kant's characterization of the Ideal as a regulative idea, not a constitutive one, DiCenso sees a flat and final ban on supersensible ontology. Charitably wishing to make Kant self-consistent, DiCenso casts about for an interpretive key to the several passages, in the Critique of Practical Reason and Religion, that seem on their face to commit Kant to belief in a supersensible author of nature.

He finds it, he thinks, in the third Critique, published immediately prior to Religion and presumably a good place to look for evidence of Kant's views at this stage of his career. There, contrasting symbolic or indirect representation of concepts with the schematic representations familiar from the first Critique, Kant writes, "all of our cognition of God is merely symbolic, and anyone who takes it . . . as schematic, lapses into anthropomorphism" (V:353).[5] A manifestly similar distinction, expressed in terms of two types of schematism, is introduced in an important footnote in Religion Part II. DiCenso concludes from these passages that discourse about supersensibles in Kant's late ethico-religious writings should be construed, across the board, in as-if terms. Such discourse has "pedagogical power" but no ontological significance; to suppose otherwise is to lapse into anthropomorphism.

The link DiCenso makes between Kant's general discussion of symbolism and the use of biblical imagery in Religion is undoubtedly correct. His exposition of this link is one of several important contributions his book will make to scholarly discussion of Religion. It is a plainly appropriate frame for Kant's treatment of "historical faiths" in Part III. And it affords us more precise terms in which to analyze, for instance, Kant's discussion of Jesus of Nazareth as "the personified idea of the good principle" in Part II. DiCenso helpfully calls our attention to passages, like the one just mentioned (VI:60-62) in which the dominant verb is vorstellen -- to  represent. In such passages, Kant discusses the appropriateness -- the appropriateness, that is, to the idea of moral perfection -- of certain details of the life of Jesus of Nazareth as related in the gospels.

Is this, though, the master key that DiCenso makes it out to be? Does it demonstrate, as DiCenso would have it, Kant's comprehensive rejection of "any literal . . . approach to the symbol systems he discusses" (p. 94)?[6] In particular -- since I know of no one who thinks Kant believed in Jesus of Nazareth as the incarnate author of nature -- is it equally helpful with the passages that have especially interested theologizing interpreters: notably, the discussion of divine moral assistance at the end of Part I?

It is not. Indeed, it leads to serious distortions of these passages. In Part I of Religion, Kant experiments with a rationalized articulation of the Christian doctrine of original sin: a species-wide, yet genuinely blameworthy corruption. How far, he asks, can this doctrine be translated into the terms of a religion of pure reason?[7] Some versions of it, at least, cannot: in particular, the Augustinian notion of inherited guilt. Kant suggests, instead, that we think of universal moral corruption in terms of a freely adopted "supreme maxim" -- one of prioritizing the satisfaction of desire over the performance of duty -- thatsomehow every human being adopts.

Thus far, Kant's discussion would seem to be conformable to DiCenso's interpretive approach: one symbolic Vorstellung is helpful, another not. But it becomes evident, in Section III of Part I ("The human being is by nature evil") that Kant believes that universal moral corruption simply is the case, mysterious though it may be. Talk of Vorstellung is absent. Kant then spends the rest of Part I wrestling with the consequences of his affirmation: it seems to make it impossible that we should ever be worthy of happiness.[8] But the moral law within commands us to make such worthiness the organizing aim of our lives. It would seem we need some sort of assistance. And yet "the human being must make or have made himself into whatever he is or should become in a moral sense, good or evil." (VI:44)

DiCenso's comments on these passages are peculiar. He construes what Kant calls the "radical evil" in human nature in terms of the mere "inherent capacity to make [immoral] choices" (p. 56). If this were right, the idea of dutifulness Kant puts before us in Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, "which contains that of a good will though under certain subjective limitations and hindrances," (IV:397) is the idea of radical evil. But this is implausible.

One can nevertheless see why, given his interpretive assumptions, DiCenso has to say such things. Only on this basis can he brush aside the repeated appeals to an "inscrutable" divine assistance in the "General remark" at the end of Part I. If to be radically evil is just to be "free, yet fallible" (p. 56), then it is not so hard to imagine us making ourselves worthy of happiness anyway. Nothing prevents it.[9] If on the other hand, to be radically evil is to have timelessly adopted a supreme maxim subordinating duty to desire-satisfaction, then we can understand why Kant would say that the possibility "that a naturally evil human being should make himself into a good human being surpasses every concept of ours." (VI:44-5) I have no dispute with DiCenso when he emphasizes Kant's application of the principle of "ought implies can" to this dilemma: the moral law within commands that we become other and better than we are -- from which we can only conclude that we somehow can. What is dogmatic in DiCenso's treatment is his refusal to countenance that, for Kant, human effort and an inscrutable supernatural assistance might be singly necessary and conjointly sufficient to the effort. Contra a dismissive footnote, there is a great deal "in the actual text" to suggest that "Kant is considering some form of grace, literally understood, as a response to radical evil." (p. 86n)

DiCenso has published before on hermeneutics (and on Freud), and alludes to Schleiermacher's "hermeneutical circle" as he stresses his own commitment to holistic interpretation. The best and the worst of DiCenso's commentary  lie in how it deals with the problem of the hermeneutical circle.

I discussed earlier the link DiCenso establishes between (I would say some; he would say all) of Kant's references to religious doctrines and the notion of symbolism. I have said nearly nothing about DiCenso's treatment of Parts III and IV of Religion, but the diligence of his work on the second half ofReligion has filled a gap in the literature. Neither John Silber's introduction to the old Greene and Hudson translation nor Robert Adams's introduction to the di Giovanni translation deal at length with material beyond Part II.[10] DiCenso has done a scholarly service by giving the latter half of the book the sustained attention it deserves. This is indeed the portion of Religion which DiCenso seems to me to understand most deeply, perhaps because he is so strongly and openly sympathetic to Kant's account of historical faiths as "vehicles" or "shells" for a purely rational, moral religion.

The biggest problem with DiCenso's commentary is that it is dominated by a few cardinal ideas to the point of oversimplification. He reads Kant saying that there can be no supersensible knowledge, but does not inquire after the other sorts of Fürwahrhalten (holding for true) that Kant begins discussing already in the Doctrine of Method of the first Critique -- leading DiCenso to his opposition between symbolism and ontology. He stresses the opening paragraph of the first Preface ("on its own behalf morality in no way needs religion") but reduces the meaning of Kant's later remark ("morality . . . inevitably leads to religion") to the suggestion that we construct an ideal observer as a moral heuristic. The highest good and the animating concerns of the Dialectic of the second Critique thus drop away. He latches onto Kant's contrast between autonomy and heteronomy, but interprets the contrast (presumably through Freud) in terms of a threat of "infantilism", and he can make nothing -- even symbolically -- of Kant's routine references, throughout Religion, to the will of God, a notion he treats as identical with, not merely coterminous with, moral law.

This, then, is not the commentary we have been waiting for. But given the divisions among Kant scholars, no commentary could be. Everyone who writes about Kant's Religion should read this book and engage its arguments. I have been stressing the difficulties with the secularizing interpretation DiCenso embraces, because he largely ignores them. But though my sympathies are with the theologizers, it would be just as inadequate, at this stage, if someone who reads Kant as committed to a robust supersensible ontology were to write a commentary from that point of view. We can be grateful for the appearance of DiCenso's work, and hope that we may soon have a complementary work to set beside it.

[1] Particularly illuminating is his substitution of the phrase "currying of favor" for di Giovanni's "religion of rogation". (p. 84n)

[2] Beginning with Philip J. Rossi and Michael Wreen's collection, Kant's Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered (Indiana, 1991).

[3] Apart, that is, from human libertarian freedom.

[4] An argument DiCenso has developed, in monograph form, in his Kant, Religion, and Politics (Cambridge, 2011).

[5] Citations of Kant's works will be given from the Akademie edition, using the Cambridge University Press translations (unless otherwise indicated).

[6] I would have liked to see him engage Andrew Chignell's recent work on symbolism as Kant's way of supporting the real possibility of supersensibles. See, for instance, his "Real Repugnance and Belief about Things-in-Themselves" in Benjamin J. Bruxvoort Lipscomb and James Krueger, eds., Kant's Moral Metaphysics (DeGruyter, 2010).

[7] I borrow the notion of "translation" from John Hare. See The Moral Gap (Oxford, 1996), p. 40.

[8] Kant returns to this topic at the end of Part II -- and again at the end of Part III, and again at the end of Part IV. One could fairly call it an obsession.

[9] Returning to the topic at the end of Part III -- as Kant does -- DiCenso writes this about what Kant calls "the mystery of satisfaction": it "means that we retain a sense of hope and courage, and so are not deterred from moral progress by the weight of our past errors." (p. 196) This doesn't sound especially mysterious. Contrast Kant: "Since by himself the human being cannot realize the idea of the supreme good . . . and yet there is also in him the duty to promote the idea, he finds himself driven to believe in the cooperation or the management of a moral ruler of the world, through which alone this end is possible." (VI:139)

[10] I am conscious that, in responding to DiCenso, I have done the same. I have no other excuse than that this is where the controversy about the book centers.