Kant's System of Nature and Freedom, Selected Essays

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Paul Guyer, Kant's System of Nature and Freedom, Selected Essays, Oxford University Press, 2005, 384pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199273472.

Reviewed by Jennifer Mensch, The Pennsylvania State University


The thirteen essays collected together by Paul Guyer for Kant's System of Nature and Freedom represent, with three exceptions dating from the early 1990's, pieces either written or presented by Guyer since the year 2000. The one wholly new piece added to the collection nicely confirms an increasing sense throughout the volume of Guyer's ultimate interest in Kant's questions concerning right, morality, and our relationships and obligations towards nature and mankind. More than simply offering a reconstruction of Kant's understanding of the system of nature and freedom, in this collection Guyer appears to be increasingly concerned with the possibilities for thinking through Kant towards a less restrictive liberal agenda. And with this particular agenda in mind one can say that, particularly with respect to the most recent essays, he has been quite successful. The book as a whole is suitable for any advanced students wishing for detailed and careful analyses of Kant's notion of system, and certainly for anyone engaged in the niceties of Kant scholarship in general. Experts will, of course, have their quibbles, particularly with respect to parts two and three, but this is only right since these discussions are, to my mind, the richest.

An extremely detailed introduction is followed by essays divided into three parts, starting with "The System of Nature." This division contains the three early essays, and although Guyer's style and handling of the material is perhaps smoother in the later pieces, the group is no less tight for their inclusion. As a whole, the group first takes up the possibilities for systematicity in our empirical knowledge of nature: as it shifts from the task of reason in the first Critique to the role of reflective judgement in the third (chapter 1); in so far as it is recognized that necessity can hold only for those particular laws understood to be themselves part of a system of laws (chapter 2); and how we must presuppose nature to be systematic in itself, as opposed to merely heuristically so taken, for the necessity of particular laws to hold (chapter 3). The final two essays in part one take up the question of a systematic natural science. It is nice to find a discussion of Kant's Opus postummum here, particularly as Kant himself was so insistent that only this final work could account for the required transition between the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science and the physical sciences themselves. In chapter four, Guyer's specific interest in the Opus postummum is to demonstrate the way in which its attempt to provide an ether deduction parallels the general lesson regarding systematicity's status as a regulative versus constitutive principle; an attempt revealing, for Guyer, the sense that " … transcendental deductions must always straddle the border between completely pure and empirical assumptions about the nature of human experience" (76). Chapter five takes up the problem of unity among the natural sciences, returning us to the Opus postummum's attempts to reconcile organic and inorganic causation under one principle, an attempt ultimately doomed, according to Kant, given our proclivity for viewing organic life through the lens of our own freedom.

Part two collects together essays devoted to "The System of Freedom," with the first three organized around the special task imposed on agents who are ends in themselves but whose freely chosen ends must yet stand in systematic unity with the moral obligations demanded by humanity as an end in itself. This takes its first form in a discussion of Kant's notion of autonomy, opening with the argument that transcendental freedom is necessary but insufficient for autonomy, before turning to an account of the various practical means by which one can maturate towards a state of autonomy (chapter 6). Chapter seven takes up the various formulations of the categorical imperative, arguing for the formulation of humanity as an end in itself as that principle providing us with the basic moral content for all decision-making. Focusing on the connection between Kant's description of the kingdom of ends in the Groundwork and discussions of the highest good appearing in Kant's other works, Guyer argues, finally, that the two should be understood to be "equivalent" (163). This has as its happy consequence the demand that

Just as I must treat humanity as an end in itself whether in the person of others or in myself, so I must treat happiness, as the satisfaction of ends rationally chosen, as an object of morality whether in others or myself, and indeed I must do so because that is part of what it is to treat humanity as an end in itself. (167)

Following a discussion of freedom as a possible end of nature (chapter 8), Guyer moves on to the second half of part two, with its focus there on the possibilities for reconciling individual property rights with those rights legitimately claimed on behalf of the whole. Chapter nine determines individual claims to be themselves legitimated only so far as they operate within a system acceptable to and affected by all; a stance Guyer takes to be based, once again, on the imperative that we treat humanity as an end itself. Chapter ten develops this claim to the point of understanding the need for a system of global justice, as he puts it,

in principle, any human being anywhere on earth might be able to raise a claim to the use of any object anywhere on earth, so any rightful system of property must ultimately honour a global claim of fairness as well as providing a global assurance of possession. (265)

Part three, "The System of Nature and Freedom," takes up the task of a unified system of nature and freedom wherein the good can be conceived as realizable in nature. Here Kant's reflections on the possibilities for such unity are traced from his first treatment of it as a postulate of practical reason in the second Critique to its reappearance as a regulative ideal of reflective judgement in the third Critique, concluding with a reminder that Kant held fast to such a possibility as late as the Opus postummum (chapter 11). This point is further developed in chapters twelve and thirteen, so far as each decides that just as morality has its end in the highest good, and that this good must be thought of as realizable in nature, so too must nature be understood to have its own ultimate end, and that this end is itself one with "our own freedom and the object that it sets for us, the highest good" (366). Chapter thirteen also returns us to themes from chapter ten so far as it further makes a parallel argument for one's global responsibility to nature as a whole. Arguing that nature may be exploited only so far as this exploitation fits within morally acceptable ends, Guyer concludes that, "We must try to think systematically about the natural conditions for our actions and their effects on the system of nature as well as about the system of human beings" (370), and that while our knowledge of such systems must always remain indeterminate and incomplete, we should nonetheless recognize

that we stand under an obligation always to reflect systematically upon the consequences of our choices for humankind and for nature as a whole, because we cannot specify more determinately than that where our obligations to humankind must be fulfilled. (371)

As one would expect, there are a number of provocative claims throughout the collection. Some might have trouble, for example, with the discussion of autonomy and Guyer's claim that "the conditions for genuine freedom of action can be separated from Kant's metaphysical theory of the freedom of the will, although he himself did not recognize this" (6; re. chapter 6). Similarly so for Guyer's conclusion that

if particular causal laws can be known only as part of a system which is itself never completely given but is only a regulative ideal, then our knowledge of the empirical world and even the unity of our own consciousness which depends on that knowledge are also regulative ideals that are never completely given. (4; re. chapter 2).

A possible omission emerges in connection with Guyer's account of teleology in Kant's ethics. Here Guyer describes himself as wanting to "distinguish Kant's moral teleology from the assumption that morality must answer to goals that nature sets for us," an assumption that Guyer identifies with the more traditional conception of teleology advanced by the likes of Paton (6; re. chapter 8). But it seems possible to challenge Guyer's distinction by appealing to those passages oddly pushed aside in this discussion, those stemming, in particular, from the history essays of the mid-1780's. Guyer quickly dismisses Kant's conclusions there, arguing that "human reason, at least in the form of practical reason, does not seem to be an agency of nature at all, but a manifestation of human freedom" and thus that it is freedom, rather than nature, that must be understood to have human flourishing as its end (183). But Kant is clear not only in the Idea for a Universal History with Cosmopolitan Intent [1784] but in Perpetual Peace [1795] as well, that nature, under the guiding hand of providence, is responsible for bringing mankind into an admittedly "pathologically enforced" moral whole, for, as Kant puts it in the later piece, "a good national constitution cannot be expected to arise from morality, but, rather, quite the opposite, a people's good moral condition is to be expected only under a good constitution" (8:366). The demands of morality, in other words, can be reconciled with the brutal workings of nature only once nature's work has been completed, since the formation of a moral character can only follow upon or develop within a state governed by a perfect constitution; a constitution precisely along the lines of what Guyer would seem to need for any enforcement of our global obligations to both humanity and nature. Concentrating on the history essays would similarly complicate Guyer's attempt to reconcile conflicts between duties, since Kant's notion of perfectability, so well developed in the Speculative Beginnings of Human History [1786], would seem to answer Guyer's attack on the possibility that "rusting talents" might have priority over the imperfect duty to help others (272).

All such remarks notwithstanding, however, it seems uncharitable to complain about omissions in such a lengthy and comprehensive volume. Kant's System of Nature and Freedom offers us a well conceived collection of essays, essays not only devoted to an articulation of Kant's notion of system but as indeed offering us a window into Guyer's own views on the questions of global right and morality facing each of us today.