Kant's Theory of Taste, A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment

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Allison, Henry E., Kant's Theory of Taste, A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment, Cambridge University Press, 2001, pp. xvi + 424, $24.95, ISBN 0-87220-025-6 (pbk.)

Reviewed by Christian Helmut Wenzel, National Chi Nan University, Taiwan


Allison’s book is composed of thirteen chapters. These chapters are grouped into four parts that deal, respectively, with the following four topics: reflection and judgment, the four moments of judgments of taste, the moral and systematic significance of these moments, and, finally, genius, fine art, and the sublime. The book covers a wide range of topics, makes detailed connections with the other two Critiques, and is rich in its discussion of contemporary secondary literature offered by scholars such as Reinhard Brandt, Hannah Ginsborg, Paul Guyer (of whose interpretations Allison is often critical), and Béatrice Longuenesse. For these reasons I highly recommend it to anyone who wants to arrive at a better understanding of Kant’s third Critique, and it is a must for anyone who wishes to write about the issues raised in this book by Kant.

Allison gives his book the rather modest subtitle, “A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment”, and it certainly is such a reading, and a good one.

The discussion of the Analytic of the Beautiful, especially the four moments of judgments of taste, constitutes the core of Allison’s book. This is only natural if we take into account that these four moments establish the very basis of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment. Here Allison takes his bearings from Kant’s distinction of the quid facti and the quid juris. It is Allison’s claim that the Analytic of the Beautiful should be seen as concerned with the quid facti and the Deduction with the quid juris. According to Allison, the quid facti addresses the conditions under which a judgment of taste can be pure, while the quid juris deals with the legitimacy of the claim to universality, that is, whether a judgment of taste that fulfills the conditions of purity rightfully demands the agreement of others.

The first part of the book, which discusses reflection and reflective judgment, can stand by itself. It can also serve as a sophisticated introduction to Kant’s approach to aesthetics and, in particular, to Kant’s understanding of judgments of taste. But the non-specialist might not want to read this first part first, as it presupposes some knowledge of the first Critique and delves right into deeper problems discussed in the two introductions to the third Critique, problems that concern the structure of Kant’s transcendental philosophy as a whole and the question of how the third Critique fits into that structure. This presupposes knowledge of the very results of the third Critique. Nevertheless, for someone interested in these issues, reading this part might prove to be particularly fruitful. Allison here draws on Kant’s theory of judgment in the first Critique and discusses Béatrice Longuenesse’s work, especially regarding the essential role of judgment in its reflective function.

In Chapter three, Allison addresses the much disputed question whether Kant’s account of judgments of taste also works for negative judgments of taste, judgments such as “This is ugly”. He defends the claim that Kant’s theory indeed does apply to such judgments, and he is, I think, right in doing so. But he is very brief on this point (pp. 71-72). The deeper problems of how to interpret Kant’s notion of free play when it comes to negative judgments of taste and what to make of purposiveness in this case need to be discussed in more detail. Is it appropriate to consider someone to be engaged in a free play of the faculties, if he judges something to be ugly? On p. 117, Allison offers the explanation that there is a free play without harmony, a disharmonious free play. But a deeper discussion of this would be desirable. Hudson, Strub, Lohmar (’Das Geschmacksurteil ueber das faszinierende Haessliche’, in Kant’s Aesthetics, Herman Parret (ed.), Berlin, NY 1998, 498-512; not quoted), and Wenzel (’Kant Finds Nothing Ugly?’, British Journal of Aesthetics, vol. 39, no. 4, October 1999, 416-422) are further sources for this.

In chapters four through seven, Allison discusses Kant’s analysis of the judgment of taste, i.e. how Kant derives the four moments of taste according to the categories as given in the first Critique. Allison here defends the thesis that the analysis of the four moments develops in a step by step fashion. In this respect, he opposes Guyer, and he is successful in defending his point of view. In the discussion of the important paragraph nine, he focuses on the opposing views of Guyer and Ginsborg, Guyer claiming that Kant here is utterly confused and Ginsborg defending Kant against this charge. Allison sides with Ginsborg, but he thinks she goes too far in referring to certain self-referential features of judgments of taste. Whereas Guyer tries to fix Kant’s analysis by introducing two distinct acts of judgment, Ginsborg tries to help Kant by regarding the judgment of taste as “a formal and self-referential judgment that claims, not the universal validity of an antecedently given feeling of pleasure, but rather its own universal validity with respect to the object” (Allison quoting Ginsborg on p. 113). One might wonder whether Ginsborg here merely “goes too far” or whether the self-referentiality she offers is not simply logically impossible and whether the identifications she makes in this context do not make things look simpler than they actually are. After all, she goes so far as to claim that judgments of taste claim “nothing but” (Ginsborg, p. 92) their own universal communicability, and, most interestingly, that “for my faculties to be in harmony … is simply for me to claim … that my state of mind in making that claim is universally communicable” (Ginsborg, p. 85). I wonder whether such Gödel-like self-referentiality is permissible at all.

Allison’s discussion of the first two moments is close to the text, but the following discussion of the third and the fourth moments is even more so. Here Allison is less concerned with the secondary literature than he is when discussing the first two moments. He defends the position, following what Kant writes about the categories in the first Critique, that the fourth moment, the moment of modality, does not add anything new to the content of a judgment of taste. Rather, it here provides a unifying force and focus for the other moments. Allison argues that Kant’s analysis of the fourth moment does not provide a deduction, as is sometimes claimed in the secondary literature, but should be considered to be part of the quid facti. As to the role of Kant’s discussion of the sensus communis in this context, Allison claims that it gives an anticipatory hint of the connection between taste and morality, a connection that Allison tries to show is “the deepest theme of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment as a whole” (p. 158). According to Allison, there are two “oughts” involved in a judgment of taste, one a demand for agreement, and one a demand to develop taste. And it is the latter that connects to morality and that presupposes the former. Only if the judgment of taste’s demand for agreement is legitimate, can there be a moral interest to develop the capacity to make such judgments.

Allison devotes three chapters to a discussion of judgments of taste in light of their moral significance. He takes the position that the deduction of judgments of taste, i.e. the justification of their claim to universal validity, should not be seen as depending on the moral significance of such judgments. Rather, it is on their own account, so to say, that they give us hints and traces that nature is ‘‘on our side’‘ (p. 229). They can function as symbols of the morally good by exhibiting certain features that are common to aesthetic and moral reflection and that are not merely derived from moral reflection. Simply put, taste must stand on its own feet to be able to support morality. Allison believes that such a connection between taste and morality is at the very heart of Kant’s project and that it is the culminating point not only of the Dialectic, in paragraph fifty-nine, but also of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment as a whole. Aesthetic ideas are crucial for the Dialectic and for beauty as a symbol of the morally good. Kant had already introduced aesthetic ideas in connection with genius and fine art. Nevertheless, not only artistic beauty, but also natural beauty gives rise to aesthetic ideas and is suitable for symbolizing the morally good. Aesthetic reflection gives rise to aesthetic ideas and makes us strive for completion, transcendence, and the supersensible. Hence, aesthetic reflection is isomorphic to reflection on the morally good. This isomorphism, so Allison argues, is at the root of the above mentioned symbolism, and not the other way around. He also works out several different ways in which beauty provides “a pleasing propaedeutic to, or preparation for, the serious business of morality that is not already of itself moral” (p. 264).

The topics of fine art, genius, and the sublime are discussed in the last part of Allison’s book. He chooses to call this part “Parerga to the Theory of Taste”, and this already indicates the status that these topics have in the third Critique according to Allison, namely, that they stand apart from the systematic structure of Kant’s theory of taste. From the perspective of Kant’s theory of judgment, Allison’s position regarding their status seems to be correct. But from the point of view of morality, and the high status that morality seems to have in the third Critique as a whole, this position might come as a surprise. In any case, this part of Allison’s book is not short at all. The discussion of the sublime fills the last chapter, “the longest and perhaps most complex chapter in the book” (p. 9). Indeed, it is forty-three pages in length. There are many different strands to be found in Kant’s discussion of the sublime, and they often do not seem to fit together very well. This apparent lack of fit might well have to do with the fact that Kant apparently made a last minute decision to include this topic. But whatever the historical reason might be, the discussion of the sublime is systematically problematic, as evidenced, according to Allison, by the fact that, in the case of the sublime, we cannot readily see any kind of purposiveness in nature. It turns out that there is some kind of negative purposiveness involved here. The problems that this poses regarding justification of a priori grounds, might, I suggest, be similar to the problems of negative judgments of taste, judgments about the ugly, and it might have been worth while to go into more detail here, especially from a systematic point of view.

In his discussion of the sublime, as well as at many other places, a certain virtue of Allison’s style becomes apparent. He often reads Kant’s arguments in their appropriate contexts. By carefully, skillfully, and convincingly exhibiting the different interests and aspects that Kant had in mind in different particular passages, Allison explains how such passages that seem to contradict one another, in fact do not. For this reason, as well as for the breadth of material covered, Allison’s efforts are nothing short of commendable.