Kant's Thinker

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Patricia Kitcher, Kant's Thinker, Oxford University Press, 2011, 312pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199754823.

Reviewed by Nick Stang, University of Miami


Ever since the publication in 1966 of P.F. Strawson's The Bounds of Sense, many analytic philosophers have seen Kant's Critique of Pure Reason not only as a work of great historical importance, but also as a source of lasting philosophical insights about the nature of the mind and its relation to the world, even if these must be prised apart from Kant's commitment to what Strawson (and others) took to be the implausible and possibly incoherent metaphysics of transcendental idealism. Although Patricia Kitcher disagrees with Strawson on important interpretive and philosophical points, she falls squarely within this 'Strawsonian' tradition of mining the Critique for philosophical illumination. In her wide-ranging study of Kant's theory of the 'cognitive subject,' Kitcher argues that Kant is very much 'our contemporary' (to use her phrase): Kant's theory of the interplay between self-consciousness and consciousness of objects provides a better solution to problems about the self-ascription of beliefs and our ability to track objects over time than more recent theorists have offered, and can even suggest fruitful new avenues of research for cognitive scientists. And, like Strawson, Kitcher thinks that Kant's most important philosophical insights are separable from the alleged metaphysical excesses of transcendental idealism, although, unlike Strawson, Kitcher denies that Kant ever held an idealist metaphysics; she maintains that Kant's transcendental idealism was always only an epistemological doctrine, not the phenomenalism that some attribute to him. I'll have more to say about Kant's idealism below.

The book is divided into three sections. The first concerns the background to Kant's theory of self- and object-consciousness in the Critique. Six brief chapters provide very helpful overviews of the discussions of these and associated issues in Kant's pre-critical writings and in the work of his predecessors -- Descartes, Locke, Leibniz, Wolff and Hume, but also lesser known figures such as Crusius, Knutzen, Eberhard and Merian. In particular, she makes a compelling case for the importance of Tetens to the development of Kant's views on the self and self-knowledge. There is extensive discussion of both Kant's Duisberg Nachlass (a set of unpublished handwritten notes from the 1770s that are often taken to contain a draft of what would become the Transcendental Deduction) and the L1 transcripts on metaphysics, compiled from student notes on Kant's lectures from the mid 1770s. Her discussion of this material, both the pre-Kantians and the pre-critical Kant, is interesting and illuminating throughout; specialists will find this part of the book quite helpful but, because it will mainly be of help to specialists, I forego further discussion of it here.

The second part is the heart of the book, containing an extensive analysis of Kant's theory of consciousness in the Transcendental Deduction as well as his attempted refutation of Rational Psychology in the Paralogisms. I discuss this material below. The third part of the book applies the interpretation developed in Part Two to respond on Kant's behalf to two influential objections: to resolve a debate about whether, for Kant, the cognitive subject as such has 'transcendental freedom'; and, in the final chapter, 'Kant our Contemporary,' to show the relevance of Kant's views to contemporary debates about the self-ascription of belief, self-blindness and our awareness of others' minds. The final chapter contains Kitcher's most extended defense of the contemporary relevance of (at least significant portions of) Kant's theory and is thus what makes this a work in the broadly 'Strawsonian' tradition I mentioned at the outset. However, since much of that discussion presupposes fairly detailed knowledge of the contemporary literature, I will not discuss it here.

The heart of Kitcher's book is her interpretation of the Transcendental Deduction and Kant's theory of apperception. Before discussing Kitcher's interpretation in some detail, let me situate it in the larger context of the Deduction. The 'Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding' (to give it its full title) is, as Kant himself acknowledges in the preface to the A edition (Axvi[1]), both the most difficult section in the Critique and the section most important to its overall argument. The aim of the Deduction is to prove that the pure concepts of the understanding, the twelve categories Kant identifies earlier in the so-called 'Metaphysical Deduction,' are objectively valid for empirical objects. Exactly what 'objective validity' means is controversial, but it is relatively clear that the problem of the objective validity of the categories is the problem of whether it is rationally legitimate to use categories like cause-effect to think about empirical objects. Kant solves this problem by arguing that the categories are conditions on the possibility of experiencing objects. We cannot experience objects unless we experience them as falling under the categories. Because empirical objects are appearances, it follows that they do fall under the categories, and hence it is rationally legitimate to think of them using the categories.

The key notion in the argument of the Deduction is what Kant calls the 'transcendental unity of apperception' (henceforth, unity of apperception), the unity that obtains among all of my conscious representational mental states in virtue of which I am (in some sense) conscious of all of them. Kant distinguishes between apperception and 'inner sense,' which I take to be episodic acts of explicit introspection that occur when I mentally attend to my own inner states. He distinguishes inner sense from apperception on the grounds that the former is 'empirical' while the latter is 'a priori.' I take this to mean (roughly) that I am conscious of various components of my conscious experiences and the relations between them, even if I do not explicitly attend to them. To use an example in the spirit of Kitcher's interpretation, in perceiving that there is a house before me and judging 'that is a house,' I am aware that I am perceiving a house and that I am making a judgment, although I may not explicitly think to myself 'I am judging' or 'I am perceiving a house.' (Explicit self-ascriptions like this are grounded on inner sense, but not identical to it; I can attend to my mental state without self-ascribing it.) Kant appears to identify the unity of apperception among representations with at least the possibility of directing inner sense at them: "the 'I think' must be able to accompany all my representations." For the 'I think' to accompany a representation R is for me to judge I think R, or, equivalently, R is my representation. My representations have the unity of apperception just in case I could explicitly think of them as mine, i.e., self-ascribe them.[2]

Kant goes on to make a series of ever more surprising claims about apperception. First, that the unity of apperception is a condition on the possibility of experience; I could not experience objects if the representations that make up such experiences did not possess the unity of apperception. Secondly, that the unity of apperception requires that my representations be 'synthesized' or combined by the mind (A108/B135). Thirdly, that this synthesis is guided by the categories (A 127/B143). It follows that, since I could not have experiences unless I were self-conscious (the unity of apperception held among my representations), I cannot experience objects without experiencing them as falling under the categories. Even more surprisingly, it follows that I cannot be self-conscious without experiencing objects as falling under the categories. This is a striking series of philosophical conclusions, and Kant commentators struggle to understand what they mean and how Kant argues for them.

Kant argues for the following biconditional, both halves of which are philosophically problematic:

(P) Subject S has unity of apperception among her representations if and only if S experiences objects.

One of the strengths of Kitcher's book is that she resolutely focuses attention on this claimed inter-dependence of object-consciousness and self-consciousness.

To make P more precise, we would need to determine what it means for a subject to experience objects. Kitcher takes the notions of 'experience' and 'empirical cognition' (which, as I understand her, she takes to be equivalent[3]) as they figure in the Transcendental Deduction to mean what she calls 'rational-empirical cognition,' or 'RE-cognition' for short. Her official definition is that RE-cognizing is judging that p when one is perceptually aware of the grounds for the judgment that p. For instance, if I merely guess correctly that the bar in front of me is made of gold, I do not RE-cognize that it is gold. But if I perceive that the object is yellow and metallic and on this basis I judge that it is gold, then my judgment is an RE-cognition. In order to make P fully precise we would also need to determine what it means for a subject to experience objects. Does it mean that all of her representations must be experiences or be incorporated into experiences of objects? This seems overly strong, since presumably all of us occasionally have visual representations (e.g., after-images) that are not experiences of objects, nor parts of any such experience. However, this formulation will do for now.

Kitcher's reconstruction of the right-to-left half of biconditional (P) -- if object-consciousness then self-consciousness -- is both plausible and interesting, although I will raise some questions about it. Her reconstruction of the left-to-right half -- if self-consciousness then object-consciousness -- is more problematic. Here is my simplified version of the argument she presents at pp. 141-142:  

  1. If a subject RE-cognizes objects, then the subject is aware of the rational relations between her judgments and other (actual and potential) judgments.
  2. Let S be a subject that RE-cognizes that p.
  3. S is aware of her judgment that p as rationally grounded in her perceptual awareness of an object. [By the definition of RE-cognition]
  4. If S is aware of her judgment as rationally grounded in her perceptual awareness then she is aware of herself as the common subject of these mental states.
  5. ∴ S is aware of herself as the common subject of her mental states. [From (3) and (4)]
  6. ∴ If S is a subject that RE-cognizes, then S is aware of herself as the common subject of her mental states. [From (5), discharging (2)]

The crucial premise here is (4), for which Kitcher gives no further argument. The principle that a subject must be aware of her representations as states of a single common subject, herself, is what Kitcher calls the 'I-Rule' (defined on p. 123); the conclusion of the argument is that any subject of RE-cognition falls under the I-Rule. Premise (4) states that if a subject is aware of one of her mental states (a judgment) as rationally grounded in another (a perception) then the I-Rule applies to her. However, this premise is by no means self-evident. Kitcher's Kant offers us no reason why a subject, in order to be aware of rational relations among her states, must be able to form I-thoughts. It is at least conceivable that there be a subject that can be aware of the rational relations among, for instance, her judgments but cannot conceptualize those judgments as her own judgments; or if it is not conceivable, Kitcher has give us no explanation of how Kant's theory excludes this apparent possibility.

Kitcher could argue in the following way:

  1. In virtue of being aware of one of her states rationally grounding another, S can evaluate whether the one state is rationally sufficient to ground the other. More generally, if S is aware of rational relations among her states, S can evaluate the rational support among her states.
  2. If S can evaluate the rational support among her states, then S can be aware of herself as the common subject of these judgments.
  3. ∴ S can be aware of herself.

Before moving on, allow me to comment briefly on the kind of self-consciousness that this kind of argument would establish. Any subject capable of RE-cognition can evaluate the rational support among her states; in doing so, she must be aware of herself as the common subject of these judgments and must hold herself bound to certain normative rules of reasoning. This would be a strengthened form of what Kitcher calls the "I Rule': in being aware that various judgments are my judgments (Kant: accompanying them with the 'I think'), I become normatively bound to bring 'unity' to them, which in this case means rejecting judgments that are incompatible with or rationally unsupported by my other judgments. My primary concern about this argument is that while it establishes the possibility of S explicitly attending to and evaluating her judgmental activity, I'm not sure it goes all the way to proving that S must possess the 'unity of apperception' Kant claims. For all the argument shows, it seems possible that S's self-awareness is highly episodic: she is in no way aware of herself in judging that p or judging that q on the basis of p and only becomes aware of herself as having made those judgments when she pauses for explicit self-reflection or is challenged to give her reason for judging that q. This does not seem to require that she be in any way conscious of those judgments while she is making them.

Kitcher might respond that in RE-cognizing that p I not only judge that p on the basis of a perceptual experience; I also am aware of myself as doing this. However, unless Kitcher wants to claim that whenever I RE-cognize an object I form the occurrent thought I am making this judgment on the basis of a perceptual experience (which is psychologically implausible), the kind of self-awareness involved in RE-cognition is compatible with my suggestion. It may be, for all that Kitcher shows, that self-consciousness is always only retrospective: awareness that one has reasoned correctly, or made the correct judgment about the visual scene, etc. However, this does not show that Kitcher's interpretation is wrong on this point. It may be that Kant simply assumes that if one is aware of one's states then one is aware of oneself as the common subject of those states. Kitcher's discussion of this half of Kant's biconditional is original, insightful and plausible.

The true challenge, however, for any interpretation of the Transcendental Deduction is to understand the other half of Kant's biconditional: if self-consciousness then object-consciousness (for Kitcher, RE-cognition). It is relatively clear from the text that Kant holds that unity of apperception requires cognition of objects (in the A edition alone: A108, A113, A114, A118, A127, etc.) This is the point at which Kitcher's interpretation falters somewhat. Below I reconstruct an argument from Kitcher's discussion of the dependence of self-consciousness on object-consciousness (pp. 135-136):

  1. If a subject S has unity of apperception, then she is aware of herself as the common subject of various mental states and their rational relations (e.g., inferential relations among judgments).[4]
  2. If S is aware of the rational relations among her mental states, then S is RE-cognizing.
  3. ∴ If a subject S has unity of apperception, then S has RE-cognitions.
Intuitively, the idea behind this argument is that having the 'unity of apperception,' as Kitcher understands it, consists in being aware of one's mental states as one's own as well as the rational relations among them. But in being able to evaluate and thus be aware of, for instance, one's inferring from p to q, one is in a position to infer from p to q while being aware of the rational ground of that inference, for instance, that p entails q. In doing so, one is RE-cognizing. The problem with this argument is that its conclusion is too weak to capture Kant's claim. Kitcher has argued, effectively, that self-consciousness requires something like conceptually mediated, rational judgments about oneself as a subject. While some early modern theorists, under the influence of a naïve 'inner sense' theory of self-consciousness, might deny this, this is not a particularly strong conclusion. But Kant is not making this relatively anodyne claim; he is making the much more striking claim that self-consciousness requires cognition of perceptually presented objects distinct from oneself, objects which are subject to certain a priori laws. In the following passage Kant states with uncharacteristic clarity that the lawfulness of empirical objects (e.g., the fact that there are exceptionless natural causal laws) is grounded in the unity of apperception:

That nature should direct itself according to our subjective ground of apperception, indeed in regard to its lawfulness even depend upon this, may well sound quite contradictory and strange. But if one considers that this nature is nothing in itself but a sum of appearances, hence not a thing in itself but merely a multitude of representations of the mind, then one will not be astonished to see that the unity on account of which alone it can be called object of all possible experience, i.e. nature, solely in the radical faculty of our cognition, namely transcendental apperception (A114).

One way to bring out the startling nature of Kant's claim is to realize that he is denying the possibility of a self-conscious subject, who can conceptualize and self-ascribe her representations, but whose representations do not represent law-governed objects in space, 'nature' as Kant defines it. A complete interpretation of the Transcendental Deduction needs to explain why Kant denies the possibility of such a self-conscious but 'rhapsodic' inner life. I don't think Kitcher succeeds at this, but, it should be added, few, if any, commentators have done better on this difficult point.

This is related to another potential weakness in Kitcher's interpretation, her interpretation of Kant's transcendental idealism. In the Introduction she argues that Kant's 'Copernican' turn in metaphysics means that in the critical philosophy what might appear to be metaphysical claims are actually epistemic claims, or, as she puts it, "true metaphysics is a priori epistemology." There are several problems with this. First of all, the textual evidence she offers in favor of this 'epistemic' interpretation is weak. She quotes Kant's claim in the Inquiry that metaphysics is "nothing other than a philosophy of the basic principles of our cognition" (Ak. 2:283), but this is an almost direct quote from Baumgarten,[5] who was no transcendental idealist.

Nor do the other two passages Kitcher quotes -- one from the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, one from a letter to Garve -- support this claim. In the first passage, Kant says that "all true metaphysics" is "drawn from the essence of the faculty of thinking" and "contains the pure actions of thought" (Ak. 4:472).[6] This only entails that "true metaphysics" is "a prioriepistemology" if metaphysics contains nothing in addition to the pure actions of thought, but Kant does not say that here. Similarly, in the second passage, Kant says that not a single "truly metaphysical proposition" can be "proved except by showing its relation to the sources of all pure rational knowledge, and, therefore, that it would have to be derived from the concept of a possible system of such cognitions" (Ak. 10:340-341).[7] But if truly metaphysical propositions have to be derived from the principles of pure rational knowledge, then presumably they are not among those principles. Kant here is only making an epistemic claim about how we can obtain metaphysical knowledge. He is not, as Kitcher claims, identifying metaphysics with a priori epistemology.

In a chapter devoted to the problem of 'noumenal affection' in Kant's system, Kitcher fills in a little more information about her epistemic interpretation of Kant's idealism. According to Kitcher, with his doctrine of the ideality of space and time Kant did not mean to claim that things in themselves are not spatiotemporal, but merely that we cannot know that the mind-independent things that causally affect our sense organs are spatiotemporal. She even suggests that contemporary cognitive science need not disagree with anything in Kant's theory of noumenal affection, although cognitive scientists are (rightfully) not as epistemically modest as Kant. On Kitcher's interpretation, Kant realizes that the spatial content of our perceptions of outer objects is not merely passively received but the result of acts of combination by our minds. He concludes from this that it is methodologically inappropriate to describe mind-independent external stimuli as spatial, whereas contemporary cognitive scientists, observing the strong correlation between the presence of outer objects and the contents of our perceptions, conclude that outer objects are spatiotemporal.

This is unsatisfying for two reasons. First of all, it flies in the face of overwhelming textual evidence that, according to Kant, things in themselves are not spatiotemporal[8] and we know that they are not spatiotemporal.[9] Secondly, the difference it posts between Kant and cognitive scientists -- Kant was simply more circumspect in inferring the spatiality of external objects -- is implausible, on both philosophical and historical grounds. Kant had ample acquaintance with philosophers who saw that the best explanation of the determinate spatial content of our perceptions of objects was that those objects really are spatial and, furthermore, have (for the most part) the spatial properties we perceive them as having; for instance, that is precisely Locke's argument that our ideas of primary qualities (e.g., extension) resemble qualities in bodies. If Kitcher is right, why would Kant not simply have followed the same inference to the best explanation? If Kant's reasons were that the spatial content of our perceptions is not merely passively received but is at least partly the result of active processing by the mind, this does not make his failure to infer the presence of spatial external objects any more reasonable. Kant would effectively be guilty of overlooking the famous 'neglected alternative': objects are spatial, and space is an a priori form of intuition, so the determinate spatial content of our perceptions is the joint result of affection by spatial external objects and spatial processing by our minds. Kitcher's portrayal of Kant as a precursor to contemporary cognitive scientists winds up representing him as an unworthy successor to Locke.

Furthermore, in the course of arguing that Kant never held the doctrine that non-spatiotemporal things in themselves causally affect us, Kitcher focuses on A251-2, which she calls the 'most problematic passage' for her interpretation; she devotes a long discussion to arguing that this passage involves no commitment to causal affection by things in themselves. However, this passage is not the nervus probandi of the 'noumenal affection' interpretation that Kitcher claims it is. In his classic defense of the noumenal affection interpretation, Erich Adickes does not even mention this passage.[10] He does, however, cite many other passages in which Kant clearly claims that things in themselves cause sensations.[11] Perhaps the clearest is from Kant's essay "On a discovery":

Having raised the question 'Who (what) gives sensible sensibility its matter, namely sensations?' [Eberhard] believes himself to have pronounced against the Critique when he says 'We may choose what we will -- we will never arrive at things in themselves.' Now that, of course, is the constant contention of the Critique; save that it posits this ground of the matter of sensory representation not once again in things, as objects of the senses, but in something super-sensible, which grounds the latter, and of which we can have no cognition. It says that the objects as things-in-themselves give the matter to empirical intuition (they contain the ground by which to determine the faculty of representation in accordance with its sensibility), but they are not the matter thereof. (Ak. 8:215)[12]

Kant accepts both empirical affection and noumenal affection.[13] While he may be able to accept contemporary psychological theories of empirical affection, he could not accept them as explanations of how non-spatiotemporal things in themselves affect us. Nor does contemporary psychology undermine Kant's reasons for thinking that things in themselves are non-spatiotemporal causes of our sensations.

In Kitcher's defense, though, noumenal affection is not one of the main focuses of her book, and problems like this are bound to arise from any work that is as ambitious and rich as Kant's Thinker. In its pages we find a coherent, plausible interpretation of the issues surrounding Kant's theory of the cognitive subject: cognition, synthesis, apperception, object-consciousness, the failure of rational psychology, whether thinking is an experience, etc. Whatever differences I may have with her specific interpretations of Kant, this does not detract from the fact that this book is a significant achievement and a lasting contribution to the field.

[1] Citations to the Critique of Pure Reason follow the customary format of giving the page in the 1781 edition (A) and the page in the 1787 edition (B), separated by a slash, e.g. A445/B573. Quotations from the Critique use the Guyer/Wood translation: Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, trans. and ed. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1998). Citations to other works of Kant give the volume and page number in the Academy edition (Ak.), Kants gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Berlin-Brandenburg Academy of Sciences (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1900- ); where appropriate, I also cite the translation I have quoted from.

[2] Kitcher denies that Kant is primarily concerned with the possibility of mere self-ascription of representations; I discuss this in note 4.

[3] Or, if not equivalent, as closely connected. I think Kitcher would accept the following principle: to experience an object is to have a perception of that object that enables one to RE-cognize it. Thus, if experience and self-consciousness mutually condition one another, so do self-consciousness and RE-cognition. It should be noted that on this point Kitcher's interpretation has strong textual support; Kant identifies experience and empirical cognition at B147.

[4] Kitcher differs from Strawson in emphasizing that Kant is concerned with the conditions, not merely of self-ascribing one's thoughts (the 'mineness' problem), but of self-ascribing them and being aware of their rational relations (the 'togetherness' problem). But the mineness problem is just a subset of the togetherness problem: to self-ascribe my thoughts as connected I must self-ascribe my thoughts simpliciter. In explaining the Deduction, I focused on the mineness problem, but I don't think I begged any questions against Kitcher in doing so. In reconstructing her arguments, I have been careful to focus on the togetherness problem.

[5] "Metaphysica est scientia primorum in humana cognitione principorum" (Metaphysica §1, Ak 17:23).

[6] Michael Friedman's translation, in Kant, Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, ed. Henry Allison and Peter Heath (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002), 187.

[7] Arnulf Zweig's translation, in Kant, Correspondence, trans. and ed. Arnulf Zweig (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1998-99).

[8] To pick only the best known examples: "Space represents no property at all of any things in themselves nor any relation of them to each other, i.e. no determination of them that attaches to objects themselves and that would remain even if one were to abstract from all subjective conditions of experience" (A26/B42); and "space itself, however, together with time, and, with both, all appearances, are not things, but rather nothing but representations and they cannot exist at all outside our mind" (A492/B500).

[9] "It is therefore indubitably certain, and not merely possible or even probable, that space and time, as the necessary conditions of all (outer and inner) experience, are merely subjective conditions of all our intuition, in relation to which therefore all objects are mere appearances and not things given for themselves in this way" (A48/B66).

[10] Erich Adickes, Kant und das Ding an Sich (Pan Verlag: Berlin, 1924), ch. 3.

[11] A190/B235, A387, A494/B522, Ak. 4:289, Ak. 4:314, Ak. 4:318, Ak. 4:451.

[12] Henry Allison's translation, in Kant, Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, ed. Henry Allison and Peter Heath (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002), 306.

[13] See A28; Ak. 4:289; Ak. 4:476.