Kant's Transcendental Proof of Realism

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Kenneth R. Westphal, Kant's Transcendental Proof of Realism, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 310pp, $80.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521833736.

Reviewed by Brigitte Sassen, McMaster University


For Kant and for many of his commentators, the virtue of the critical philosophy is that it is or endorses transcendental idealism, that is, the position that takes its basic idea from the Copernican Revolution: "we can only know a priori of things that which we ourselves put into them" KrV, Bxviii). Kant believes that once this is granted, philosophy can become a science. In this book Westphal defends a contrary position, arguing not only that transcendental idealism is "not … required for the critical tasks" (34), but that it "is unsupported, false, [and cannot] fulfill some of the key claims Kant claims it alone can fulfill" (34). But this does not mean that the critical philosophy must be rejected altogether. The critique of transcendental idealism is coupled with Westphal's positive reinterpretation. On behalf of Kant, he here presents the critical philosophy as defending an unrestricted realism, or as he puts it, a "realism sans phrase" (35). When thus reinterpreted, he claims, it can fulfill all the tasks Kant set himself: it can account for causality, it can account for moral agency, and it can offer "a penetrating, genuinely Kantian critique and refutation of global perceptual skepticism" (35). It is only on the assumption of an unrestricted, and not merely empirical, realism that philosophy can become the science Kant wanted it to be.

Given the received view of the critical philosophy as transcendental idealism (and empirical realism), this is a difficult task. Westphal begins with a discussion of what he considers Kant's chief methodological innovation, transcendental reflection, here more broadly defined as epistemic reflection (chapter one). The distinction between transcendental and epistemic reflection is a dense one, but it suffices to say that it is in virtue of transcendental/epistemic, and not empirical, reflection that Kant can delineate the a priori conditions and capacities. This methodology governs Westphal's analysis in the chapters to come. In chapter two, he provides an account of Kant's transcendental idealism that, he claims, is "a decidedly metaphysical view" (67). In other words, it is a substantive view and not, as one can conclude from what is to come, a merely methodological one. Once the field has been thus delineated, Westphal turns to his critique and reinterpretation.

The argument for a transcendental realist interpretation of the critical philosophy begins in chapter three and proceeds, as he puts it, along "three lines of criticism internal to Kant's idealism" (67). The first line of criticism centers around transcendental affinity. More specifically, Westphal argues, in chapter three, that "Kant's transcendental account of the necessary conditions of self-conscious human experience entails that there is a genuine, necessary, a priori, formal, yet also material (and mind-independent) condition for self-conscious experience, namely, the transcendental affinity of the sensory manifold" (67). The second line of criticism is announced at the outset of chapter four and is significantly more complex. Here Westphal takes his cue from what he argues is transcendental idealism's inability to "justify realism about ordinary causal judgments" (127). Westphal then turns to the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science in order to see whether Kant has established there what he was unable to show in the first Critique, viz. that every "physical event has an external cause" (127). Westphal takes this question on in the two subsequent chapters, where he deals, respectively, with Kant's account of matter (chapter five) and with Kant's account of the law of inertia (chapter six). Together Westphal claims these chapters show that transcendental idealism "cannot provide the complete analysis and justification of causal judgments Kant claims it alone can provide" (173). Although there is supposed to be a third line of criticism establishing the untenability of transcendental idealism, it is not clear what this third line of criticism is, unless chapters five and six respectively constitute the second and third lines of criticism. In the seventh and final chapter, Westphal turns to what he himself designates as the constructive project that seeks to show that "only an unqualified realist can defend realism transcendentally" (223).

Although I am sympathetic to Westphal's overall realist reinterpretation of the critical philosophy, I do wonder whether he has successfully established this point, or whether the proposed reinterpretation might not have significant costs in spite of any advantages it may offer. Consider the first part of the argument, the one that makes a case for what he calls a "mental content externalism" (6). Up to a point, Westphal and Kant are on the proverbial same page. Thus, both hold that sensation is passive such that we must be affected by something other than ourselves. Indeed, this claim was a staple in Kant's repeated arguments against the subjective idealist interpretation of transcendental idealism. He insisted that he had never doubted the existence of mind-independent things, he had only doubted that we can know them as they are in themselves. As is well known, and as Westphal acknowledges, the thesis that our senses are affected by something other than ourselves has generated much criticism and debate over the centuries. Here we may look to Jacobi and his critique of the argument by affection: this argument conflicts with the transcendental philosophy since it makes a causal claim about things in themselves, a claim Kant had no right to make since the transcendental conditions of knowledge, including causality, do not apply to things in themselves. Westphal has an answer to this objection but consider first just where he and Kant part company on the issue of affection and transcendental idealism.

While Kant maintains that we cannot know things as they are in themselves, Westphal, using the transcendental/epistemic reflection he discussed in chapter one, maintains that in addition to the formal conditions the critical philosophy identifies, there must also be material conditions and he accords these material conditions rather greater weight than Kant did. Interestingly however, he does not for that reason want to abandon the central idea of the Copernican Revolution, viz., that there are a priori conditions of knowledge. To make these two requirements cohere, he suggests a rather interesting shift in transcendental idealism: rather than say, as per transcendental idealism, that the "universal conditions necessary for our self-conscious experience or for our perception of objects do not hold independently of human subjects" (68), Westphal maintains, as per the unrestricted realism he favors, that "outer objects must meet [certain conditions] if we are to experience them" (77). But even if this is so, this need not imply transcendental idealism; it need not imply that those a priori conditions are merely contributed by the subject and not as a matter of fact found in objects. It might well be, for instance, that we can only experience spatial and temporal objects, but there is nothing standing in the way of the conclusion that these spatial and temporal properties are features of objects as mind-independent things in themselves rather than conditions the subject injects into experience. Given this switch, we can still only experience those things that are in line with the conditions of the possibility of experience that constitute the human perceptual cognitive apparatus -- we could not experience those things that do not meet those conditions. We could similarly project (on the basis of transcendental reflection) that the external world has at least minimal coherence, because if it did not, then we could not experience it. It is fascinating how Westphal uses Kant's arguments against him.

But is this position sustainable? To be sure, Westphal claims that this switch in focus deals with several of the chestnuts that have haunted Kant interpretation over the centuries. There is, for instance, the matter of Kant's insistence that things in themselves are not in space and time that has troubled Kant-commentators since the book first went to press. Pistorius raised the neglected alternative argument, as it is called, as early as 1784 and the neo-Kantians made it famous. The alternative is not neglected on the realist interpretation. There is similarly the problem of affection. As Westphal indicates, Kant maintained the passivity of sensation. The subject and its organs of sense must be affected by something other than itself, but, as I have already indicated, this gave rise to Jacobi's charge of the illegitimate application of the category of causality to things in themselves. Once the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is abandoned, as it is on Westphal's account, this is no longer a problem. Finally, Westphal also claims to be able to deal with moral agency. This point does not emerge until later, in the constructive chapter seven, but note that it translates into the claim that psychological determinism is at most regulative, not constitutive. Moreover, the conflict between freedom and determinism can be solved quite without transcendental idealism, which he claims "is an excessive philosophical overreaction to the problems of the Third Antinomy" (241). It is hard to imagine that this would satisfy those committed to transcendental idealism, but it is certainly an interesting thesis.

Westphal does not here support his realist reinterpretation by listing the advantages it is presumed to have over transcendental idealism. Rather, his conclusion is cemented by three, as he puts it, "considerations" (80): void space (§20), the "transcendental analyses of the necessary conditions of unified self-conscious experience" (82) and their link to transcendental idealism, which Westphal denies (§21), and transcendental affinity (§§22 - 6). The first two considerations follow the same reasoning. Westphal maintains that in each case, Kant's claim that only transcendental idealism can account for the item(s) under consideration does not follow. It does not follow because Kant has not considered all of the alternatives. In each case, Kant is said to base his argument on a disjunctive syllogism: "either empiricism or transcendental idealism is true; empiricism faces insuperable difficulties; therefore transcendental idealism is true" (83). Westphal objects in each case to the major premise of the syllogism because it does not consider all of the alternatives. In particular, Kant has not considered the realist alternative. We might acknowledge the necessity of transcendental conditions but, as per Westphal's realist interpretation briefly sketched above, deny that this has idealist implications. It is instructive that Westphal ultimately concludes that both Kant and Allison, who takes the place as prime defender of transcendental idealism, were wrong to think "that transcendental idealism is the only possible explanation of there being transcendental conditions of possible experience" (122).

The treatment of transcendental affinity is more complex. Westphal turns here to the material conditions of knowledge that are generally acknowledged but remain unexplored. According to him, they must be equally material and formal. That is to say, transcendental affinity "is a formal condition concerning relations among the matter of sensation, and is also a material condition that must depend upon or derive from the matter of sensation (and whatever its source may be)" (87). At this point, Westphal exploits a tension he perceives at the heart of the critical philosophy. This is the tension between, on the one hand, the givenness of the matter of sensation and, on the other hand, the synthetic ordering of the given manifold done by the understanding in virtue of the a priori conditions of experience. He does not see how the two sides could be squared without assuming that the sensory manifold has some order or affinity of its own and claims that "[c]ombinability must be a function of the elements thus combined" (89). Since Kant fails to account for the "affinity of the sensory manifold" (91), he cannot resolve the tension between what is given and what is thought. Transcendental idealism, accordingly, fails. We must make room for a transcendental analysis of conditions of experience without succumbing to transcendental idealism.

Throughout these deliberations, Westphal has placed Kant and Allison side by side as staunch defenders of transcendental idealism. It is not surprising, accordingly, that he ends this chapter and first critical avenue with a critique of Allison's methodology (§28). Unfortunately, the text here is the 1983 edition of Kant's Transcendental Idealism. It would be interesting to see whether his critique would also apply to the revised and enlarged edition of this text published in 2004.

As I have already indicated, I am quite sympathetic to this reinterpretation. Still, I have to wonder whether the critical philosophy without transcendental idealism can remain the critical philosophy. Clearly, Kant did not think so and equally clearly, Westphal thinks it can. I think ultimately I might have to side with Kant on this issue. In addition to the desire to turn philosophy into a science, Kant developed transcendental idealism in order to deal with the paradoxes of the continuum that we find treated in the Antinomies. Aside from the Third Antinomy and Kant's rather unbelievable resolution of it, Westphal does not discuss the Antinomies. One wonders how Kant's account might square with this new realist interpretation of the critical philosophy. As well, I wonder whether Westphal's interpretation does not carry its own possibly unwarranted assumption. Given that he seems to want to both hold on to the a priori yet also maintain a realist (not an idealist) stance, I have to ask whether he does not have to assume some sort of pre-established harmony between the subjective and the objective, the sort of pre-established harmony Kant rejected in the Deduction (KrV, B167-8).