Kant und die Wissenschaften vom Menschen

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Thomas Sturm, Kant und die Wissenschaften vom Menschen, Mentis, 2009, 565pp., €74,00 (pbk), ISBN 9783897856080.

Reviewed by Robert B. Louden, University of Southern Maine


Kant und die Wissenschaften vom Menschen (Kant and the Human Sciences) is a revised version of the author's 2007 Ph.D. dissertation, directed by Reinhard Brandt at Phillips-Universität Marburg. Weighing in at 565 pages and with a Bibliography of well over 600 items, it is clearly a scholarly tour de force. At once both historical and critical in orientation, Sturm seeks to situate the development of Kant's pragmatic anthropology within the extensive eighteenth-century debate on the human sciences (here he focuses primarily on psychology, anthropology, and history) as well as to offer a qualified defense of the scientific integrity of Kant's project. "Kant's effort to establish a new form of anthropology," Sturm argues, is "an intentional, original, and in many respects even to this day interesting reaction to contemporary controversies concerning the most promising form of a universal science of man" (9). However, at the end of his lengthy investigation the author warns readers that "this does not mean that Kant's anthropology in its insights on human action and its foundations . . . constitutes a scientific masterwork" (528). The author's reflections on Kant's project are not meant as a nostalgic plea to contemporary social scientists to begin constructing Kantian-inspired pragmatic anthropologies.

Sturm's book is divided into eight chapters, and includes an extensive Bibliography of primary and secondary sources and a Name Index. Each chapter is also subdivided into approximately twenty titled sections, including an Introduction and concluding "Summary and Evaluation," all of which are printed out at the beginning of the text as an Analytical Table of Contents.

Chapter I, "The Most Neglected Science," takes its title both from Kant's opening remark in his 1772-73 Collins anthropology lecture that "nothing indeed appears to be more interesting for the human being than precisely this one [viz., anthropology], and yet none is more neglected [mehr vernachläßiget] than precisely this one" (25: 7),[1]as well as from Hume's pronouncement in his Treatise of Human Nature that "Human Nature is the only science of man; and yet has been hitherto the most neglected" (I.iv.7; cf. Sturm 23). Chapter I primarily sets the stage for the remaining discussion, and concludes with a summary of the subsequent chapters (48-51). Kant's mature conception of a distinctively pragmatic anthropology is "the center of gravity" in his views about the empirical human sciences, and it therefore occupies the center of Sturm's study (40). But because Strum is particularly concerned with the development of Kant's conception of the human sciences, he also pays detailed attention to Kant's multiple classroom Lectures on Anthropology (1772-96) as well as to a wide swath of his other works dealing with human nature.[2]

In the opening section, Sturm lays out two guiding questions that are intended to form "the systematic connecting thread" of the entire book: 1) Why are the human sciences in such a comparatively unsatisfactory state? 2) Should we be satisfied with this state of affairs, or should we reflect rather on how we can work toward the improvement of the human sciences? (26). The leading role assigned to these two broad questions is one of the many indicators of Sturm's particular approach to Kant's pragmatic anthropology. Unlike a large number of contemporary Kant scholars and critics, he takes the scientific aspirations of Kant's project extremely seriously. Also, he is not interested in offering readers a "pure historical-genetic interpretation" of Kant's texts or in presenting and evaluating Kant's position "from a contemporary point of view" (47), but rather in the intellectual controversies out of which Kant developed his arguments and views. As a result, Sturm warns readers, "the investigation is not value-free" (48). This wide-angle approach also enables him to engage not only with the growing legions of Kant scholars who discuss Kant's writings on human nature (nearly all of whom he manages to disagree with) but also with other philosophers and scholars who have contributed to the ongoing debate about the nature of the human sciences.

In Chapter II ("Debates about Psychology and Anthropology in the Eighteenth Century"), Sturm focuses in particular on two leading options that Kant eventually rejects: "empirical psychology" and "physiological anthropology." The former, which usually goes by the name of "introspective psychology" in Anglophone circles, is associated primarily with Christian Wolff and Alexander Baumgarten in Germany, and starts from the assumption that the soul is a distinct object that can be studied empirically -- viz., through introspection and reflection, or what Locke called "that notice which the mind takes of its own operations" (An Essay Concerning Human UnderstandingII.i.4; cf. Sturm 61-62).

Physiological anthropology, which was championed by Ernst Platner and other "philosophical physicians," focuses not merely on psychic life or what Locke called "the internal operations of our minds" (Essay II.i.2) but rather on "the 'whole' man" (70), and seeks to investigate psychophysical connections. Platner, Sturm claims, regarded ontological positions on the mind-body relation as irrelevant, and viewed his own anthropology as an attempt to overcome the separation between physiological and psychological investigations (75-76). For instance, at the beginning of his 1772 Anthropologie für Aerzte und Weltweise (Anthropology for Physicians and Philosophers), Platner lays out three approaches to the study of human beings: an external, physiological approach; an internal, psychological approach; and his preferred third option, anthropology: "Finally, one can consider the body and soul together in their mutual circumstances, constraints, and relations, and this is what I call anthropology. . . . I have therefore sought just as little to write a psychology, as an anatomy or a physiology" (xvii; cf. Sturm 76).

Extensive criticisms of both of these traditions were also developed in the eighteenth century. For instance, Kant's former student Marcus Herz, himself a physician, argued in his 1773 review of Platner's book for a "precise separation of metaphysics and medicine." Philosophical physicians, he urged, should be more empirical, less speculative, and he noted that Platner's conclusions "often rested on too slender an empirical basis" (79). Kant, in a well-known letter to Herz written toward the end of 1773, states: "I have read your review of Platner's Anthropologie" (10: 145), but he does not comment on any of Herz's specific criticisms of Platner's program. And Christian Gottfried Schütz, an ardent disciple of Kant's who would later handle the proofreading for the second edition of his Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (see Schütz to Kant, May 22, 1800, 12: 307), along with David Hume both raised multiple objections against introspective psychology. Hume, for instance, notes in the Introduction to his Treatise:

When I am at a loss to know the effects of one body upon another in any situation, I need only put them in that situation, and observe what follows from it. But should I endeavour to clear up after the same manner any doubt in moral philosophy, by placing myself in the same case with that which I consider, 'tis evident this reflection and premeditation would so disturb the operation of my natural principles, as must render it impossible to form any just conclusion from that phænomenon. We must therefore glean up our experiments in this science from a cautious observation of human life, and take them as they appear in the common course of the world, by men's behavior in company, in affairs, and in their pleasures (cf. Sturm 84).

This famous objection to introspection is one of several "considerable difficulties" encountered by all attempts to arrive at a science of anthropology noted by Kant in the Preface to his Anthropology (see 7: 120-21), and it is also why he urges anthropologists to instead seek help from "world history, biographies, even plays and novels" (7: 121). Each of these genres can serve as a valuable source of information about human nature, untainted by the distorting effects of agents' own attempts at introspection.

Johann Nicolaus Tetens would later defend a modified introspectionism (104-08), and other theorists such as Johann Gottlob Krüger would also explore the possibilities of an experimental psychology (108-13). But in the end no definitive conclusion to these methodological controversies is reached (49, 124), and Kant's own plan to develop an anthropology that is "completely different [ganz anders]" (letter to Herz toward the end of 1773, 10: 145), as Sturm himself acknowledges, is not grounded in any of these particular options (125).

Chapter III, "Kant's Concept of Science," examines "the idea of a social science" not through the lens of debates among Kant's contemporaries but rather through Kant's own understanding of science. Central to this understanding is the idea of systematicity or systematic unity. For instance, in the Critique of Pure Reason Kant announces that "systematic unity is that which first makes ordinary cognition into science" (A 832/B 860), and this is also a criterion that he applies to the new science of anthropology. At the beginning of the Friedländer anthropology lecture (1775-76), he states:

In order to have world knowledge [Welt Kenntnis], one must study a whole, out of which whole the parts can subsequently be determined, and this is a system, insofar as multiplicity [das manigfaltige] has arisen out of the idea of the whole. The one who knows how to situate multiplicity in the whole of cognition has a system, which differs from an aggregate, in which the whole does not originate out of the idea, but through composition (25: 470; cf. Sturm 134).

And twenty-three years later, in the Preface to his Anthropology, Kant repeats his claim that a properly scientific anthropology should be "systematically formulated" (7: 119). But systematicity in Kant's sense comes in two varieties: inner and outer. Inner systematicity concerns the extent to which the various knowledge claims and findings in a science are united by an integrated point of view -- whether they form what Kant calls "a whole [ein Ganzes]" rather than a mere "aggregate." External systematicity concerns the relations between different sciences -- is there a coherent rationale for their borderlines, and do all of them together form a comprehensive system of science? In the Mrongovius anthropology lectures (1784-85), for instance, Kant states: "One must see science in terms of universal purposes, how everything is interconnected with a principal purpose. This is an architectonic talent and the source of systems" (25: 1309; cf. Sturm 175).

While determining the precise contours and applicability of these two senses of systematicity is no easy task (particularly with regard to the human sciences), Sturm resists the judgment that Kant's conception of science "lies in pieces," and instead concludes that despite several shortcomings it "contains elements that are understandable and usable" (181).

In Chapter V ("The Critique of Physiological Anthropology"), Sturm returns to the second option surveyed in Chapter II -- Platner's physiological anthropology -- focusing now on Kant's grounds for rejecting it. Kant expresses dissatisfaction with Platner's program as early as 1773, when he informs Herz that in his own anthropology he omits entirely the "eternally futile inquiries as to the manner in which bodily organs are connected with thought" (Kant to Herz, toward the end of 1773, 10: 145; cf. Sturm 265). But his doubts about psychophysiological investigations can be traced back even further. For instance, in his 1766 Dreams of a Spirit-Seer Elucidated by Dreams of Metaphysics, he asks: "Where is the place [der Ort] of this human soul in the world of bodies?" (2: 324), concluding that because "the nature of the soul is basically not known enough" (2: 326; cf. Sturm 268-70) no position on this topic can be adequately defended. Kant's clearest denunciation of the goal of locating the "seat of the soul" in the body is contained in his late work, From Soemmerring's On the Organ of the Soul, where he recommends that "the concept of a seat of the soul . . . had better be left entirely out of the picture" (12: 31-32; cf. Sturm 270-75).

Sturm's main concern in this chapter is to determine why Kant rejects physiological anthropology. Does he regard the program as fundamentally incoherent or merely as irrelevant (266)? Strum defends the irrelevance thesis. Kant rejects physiological explanations of mental phenomena because they are irrelevant to anthropology as he conceives it, for Kantian anthropology aims not merely at "school knowledge" (Schulkenntnis) but at "knowledge of the world" (Weltkenntnis) (50, 281-89). The latter is practical and pragmatic; the former, theoretical. As Kant remarks in a 1775 text: "knowledge of the world serves to procure the pragmatic element for all otherwise acquired sciences and skills, by means of which they become useful not merely for school but rather for life" (2: 443).

During the eighteenth century, history was often viewed both as a prime example of a pragmatic discipline and as a key contributor to the science of man, and in Chapter VI ("History in the Eighteenth Century: Pragmatic and Philosophical") Sturm documents Kant's important debt to this research tradition. Advocacy of a distinctively pragmatic history goes back as far as Polybius (c. 200-after 118 B.C.), who repeatedly describes his own approach as a "pragmatic history" (pragmatikÄ“ historia) (The Histories I.ii.8, IX.ii.4; cf. Sturm 311). In eighteenth-century Germany, authors such as Johann Christoph Gatterer, Johann David Köhler, Thomas Abbt, and Johann Matthias Schroeckh intensified this advocacy (313-20), but here as elsewhere the giant was Hume. In his Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, Hume argues that the chief use of history is to discover universal principles of human nature, and that it should therefore form the basis for the new science of man:

These records of wars, intrigues, factions, and revolutions, are so many collections of experiments, by which the politician or moral philosopher fixes the principles of his science, in the same manner as the physician or natural philosopher becomes acquainted with the nature of plants, minerals, and other external objects, by the experiments which he forms concerning them (VIII.i; cf. Sturm 347).

And in fact Hume is the only Enlightenment historian Kant explicitly mentions in his anthropology lectures (334). At the beginning of Friedländer, he notes that "Hume, in his History of England, provided a proof" of the benefits that can accrue to a history oriented toward uncovering universal principles of human nature rather than merely recording "the change in the kingdoms" and "descriptions of battles" (25: 472; cf. Menschenkunde 25: 1105 and Sturm 339).

However, Hume himself did not use the term "pragmatic history," and those who did use it did not all use it in the same way (334, 312). While the pragmatic turn in Kant's conception of anthropology is certainly indebted to this particular debate among historians, Kant eventually decides that the pragmatic historians are not pragmatic enough. In Mrongovius he states:

Everybody now demands that a history be pragmatic, but there still are extremely few history books that are written strictly pragmatically [recht pragmatisch]. For, because the authors of many history books possess little knowledge of human beings [wenig Menschenkenntnis], they cannot even create a correct concept of a pragmatic history, much less carry it out (25: 1212; cf. Sturm 305, 340).

Most would-be pragmatic historians themselves lack sufficient Menschenkenntnis to write a truly pragmatic history.

In Chapter VII ("The Inner Systematicity of Pragmatic Anthropology"), Sturm turns finally to the internal structure of Kant's pragmatic anthropology itself, using the key concept of Menschenkenntnis to explain Kant's disagreements with both physiological anthropologists and pragmatic historians. This chapter, the longest in the book (98 pages), is divided into two parts, corresponding more or less to the two parts of (most versions of) Kant's anthropology lectures: "Menschenkenntnis, Part I: Cognition, Feeling, and Desire" (370-404) and "Menschenkenntnis, Part II: Characteristic" (404-64). Sturm's primary claim in Chapter VII is that "despite certain weaknesses Kant's anthropology contains more inner systematicity" than many different interpreters would have us believe (51, cf. 465).

In Part I, Sturm shows how Kant builds off of traditional faculty psychology in his quest to find a better way to analyze human action (51, 391-94). On Kant's view, our mental faculties are interconnected via their focus on action. As he states in the Menschenkunde transcription (1781-82): "All of our faculties come down to activity and performance [laufen auf Thätigkeit und Ausübung hinaus], and the human being has in himself the principles of action" (25: 1068; cf. Sturm 393). Pragmatic historians and others who wish to explain human action therefore need a background knowledge of human cognition, feeling, affect, and passion in order to adequately explain human action. But this necessary background knowledge is provided by Menschenkenntnis, which, as we saw earlier, Kant claims pragmatic historians possess little of. And the attempts of physiological anthropologists to explain our mental life in physiological terms is irrelevant from a pragmatic perspective. As Kant asserts in Friedländer:

Everything that bears no relation to the prudent conduct [klugen Verhalten] of human beings, does not belong to anthropology. Only that which from a prudent use in life can immediately be drawn, belongs to anthropology. Everything where ideas arise belongs to speculation and not in anthropology, in the way Platner delineated it (25: 472; cf. Sturm 293).

In Part II, Sturm explores what is "probably the strongest innovation in the structure of Kantian anthropology: the examination of human character" (369). Part II of Kant's mature anthropology -- "Anthropological Characteristic" -- is intended as an application of the doctrine of faculties depicted in Part I ("Anthropological Didactic"). But what exactly does Kant mean by this? Sturm argues that the most significant innovation in this second part of Kant's anthropology is his introduction of the concept ofDenkungsart (way of thinking), a term that first occurs in the Pillau transcription (1777-78) (25: 821-22; cf. Sturm 418-19). Kant contrasts Denkungsart with Sinnesart(way of sensing) -- the latter is passive, while the former is active and concerns "what the human being makes of himself" (Anth 7: 292; cf. Sturm 419). In his emphasis on character self-formation and Denkungsart, Kant introduces a bold conception of human beings as active agents that is missing from standard models of the human sciences. We are producers of our own development, rather than mere causal products of nature or society (464).

A related point that Sturm also discusses in Part II is Kant's growing conviction concerning the limited inconstancy of human nature (441-46). Like other Enlightenment intellectuals, Kant sees human development as a dynamic process involving fundamental changes produced by humans' own activity. As he remarks in Friedländer: "it is a philosophy of the lazy, if one believes that [things] will always remain as they are now. For as little as things 1,000 years ago were as they are now, just as little will they be so after [another] 1,000 years; therefore great changes are to be hoped for" (25: 694; cf. Sturm 445). While this theme of historical development is usually associated with Kant's popular essays on the philosophy of history, Sturm argues that it too originates in the anthropology lectures (355).

Finally, in Chapter VIII ("The Outer Systematicity of Pragmatic Anthropology"), Sturm evaluates Kant's mature conception of anthropology, first by examining its object, goals, and method (470-518), and second by asking whether pragmatic anthropology is indeed a science (518-29). As hinted at earlier in this review, Sturm gives a qualified yes to the science question -- he is "more optimistic than most interpreters and critics" concerning the scientific credentials of pragmatic anthropology (470). In his discussion of the object, goals, and method of pragmatic anthropology, Sturm stresses that it is an "empirical science of action" (471), but also an "empirical investigation of human freedom" (475). [One of his two epigraphs for this chapter is Kant's famous statement in the Preface of the Anthropology that pragmatic anthropology is an investigation of what the human being "as a free-acting being makes of himself, or can and should make of himself" (7: 119; cf. Sturm 466, 475).]

However, despite pragmatic anthropology's explicit focus on what we as free-acting beings should make of ourselves, Sturm, like his teacher Reinhard Brandt, tries hard to draw a clear, bright line between pragmatic anthropology and ethics. Kant "does not regard ethics as an empirical discipline -- except during a phase in the 1760s" (42). In the ethical works Kant "speaks of a 'practical' or 'moral', never of a 'pragmatic' anthropology; and conversely he refrains from characterizing either the Anthropology Lectures or the Anthropology as a 'moral' or 'practical anthropology'" (500). "From anthropology neither universal moral norms . . . nor special norms from the highest moral principles are derived" (505). "Kant does not want his anthropology . . . to be understood as something so vague as an empirical counterpart to moral philosophy or as a part of his practical philosophy" (509). The only remaining viable option, he claims, is "an indirect relationship between anthropology and moral philosophy" consisting in "an analysis of the empirical conditions for the realizability of certain rational rules of action for the necessary character- or personality-structure" (508). But for those of us who turn to Kant's anthropological texts in part to try and learn more about what he elsewhere calls "the second part" of morals, "philosophia moralis applicata, moral anthropology, to which the empirical principles belong" (Moral Mrongovius II 29: 599), this is extremely thin gruel.

Sturm's Kant und die Wissenschaften vom Menschen is the most extensive and informative investigation of the intellectual background of Kant's views on the human sciences with which I am familiar, and I recommend it to anyone who has serious interests in this important topic.[3] At the same time, to a certain extent the book's virtues are also its vices. The author spends more time examining options obviously rejected by Kant than he does wrestling with the unique and not-always-easy-to-articulate character of Kant's own conception of anthropology. And the author's own considerable interests in psychology, philosophy of mind, and foundational issues in philosophy of science sometimes put him at a disadvantage when it comes time to look at things from a pragmatic point of view.

[1] Kant's works are cited by volume and page number in Kants gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Royal Prussian (later German, then Berlin-Brandenburg) Academy of Sciences (Berlin: Georg Reimer, later Walter de Gruyter), 29 vols., except for quotations from the Critique of Pure Reason, which are cited by the customary use of the pagination from its first (A) and second (B) editions. When available, I use -- with occasional modifications -- the English translations in The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant (general editors Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood; Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992-), 16 vols. The traditional Academy volume and page numbers (and also the A and B pagination from the Critique of Pure Reason) are reprinted in the margins of most recent editions and translations of Kant's writings.

[2] New English translations of most of Kant's works on human nature are available in Kant, Anthropology, History, and Education, ed. G. Zöller and R. Louden (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007; paperback, 2011). English translations of substantial portions of his Lectures on Anthropology are available in Kant,Lectures on Anthropology (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, in press), ed. A. Wood and R. Louden.

[3] The ideal approach would be to read Sturm's text in conjunction with Reinhard Brandt's Kommentar zu Kants Anthropologie in pragmatischer Hinsicht (Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag, 1999), a strategy that Sturm himself hints at in a footnote (47n36).