Placeholder book cover

Allen W. Wood, Kant, Blackwell Publishers, 2005, 216pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0631232826.

Reviewed by Michael Losonsky, Colorado State University


A unique and significant feature of Allen Wood's both lively and magisterial introduction to Kant's philosophy in the Blackwell Great Minds series is Wood's order of exposition. After an introductory chapter on Kant's life and works and four chapters centered on the Critique of Pure Reason, Wood does not as one might expect turn to Kant's ethical theory, but instead turns to Kant's philosophy of history first, reflecting Wood's belief that Kant's anthropology "exercised a powerful but subtle influence" on all aspects of his mature philosophy (p.9).

Kant turned to anthropology during his silent decade, but according to Wood this turn is part of Kant's life-long interest in the natural sciences. Wood argues that "There never was any 'dogmatic slumber' from which to awake" (p.7) and that Kant's claim that Hume's philosophy awoke him from his "dogmatic slumber" in the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics was merely a literary device on Kant's part to get his readers to find their "own path to his critical philosophy" (ibid.). In fact, it is in reaction to dogmatic, a priori physiological accounts of human nature and history that Kant turns to anthropology. According to Wood, Kant always had a deep skepticism about the human capacity to gain scientific knowledge of its own nature (p.9).

One might expect that this perspective on Kant would yield an introduction that is devoted mostly to Kant's writings on religion, history and anthropology, but this is not the case. Wood devotes four chapters to Kant's first Critique: chapter 2 on "synthetic a priori cognition," chapter 3 on "the principles of possible experience," and chapter 4 on "the limits of cognition" and the ideas of reason, and chapter 5 on "the transcendental dialectic".

In fact, the chapter on synthetic a priori propositions will perhaps disappoint the reader looking forward to the influences of Kant's anthropology on Kant's theoretical philosophy, but it certainly will not disappoint most readers. Wood deftly explains Kant's view that the objects of human knowledge are in part determined by our own cognitive faculties, carefully distinguishing Kant's constructivism in his theory of knowledge from nativism. The content of knowledge is always empirical and the source of a priori knowledge is the exercise of certain faculties for organizing experience.

Wood emphasizes Kant's duality of intuitions and thoughts in Kant's account of human cognition and that for Kant intuitions "put us in immediate contact with objects through the influence they have on us" (p.35). This duality of objectivity and perspectivity, Wood believes, gives Kant the resources for combating skepticism. The very notion of perspectivity requires the notion of an object with which we are in immediate contact. Moreover, Wood argues, the notion of my perspectivity requires the possibility of other perspectives.

This response to the skeptic is, on Wood's account, the focus of the transcendental deduction, which is the topic of chapter 3 in Wood's introduction. Wood rightly maintains that Kant's discussion in the transcendental aesthetic is a confusing mix of projects. Wood's final assessment of Kant's theory of space and time is that Kant fails to give a unified theory of physical and phenomenal space and time, but that this failure is not just Kant's problem, but a problem for contemporary physics, which also lacks a unified account and without it physics is not "an intellectually satisfying department of knowledge" (p.38).

After some instability in his characterization of Kant's skeptical target, Wood clarifies that Kant's strategy against the skeptic is to show that the "instantiation" of concepts such as object, substance, or cause "serves as a necessary condition for the possibility of experience" (p.47). Thus the target of the deduction is the skeptic who doubts our claims that there are instantiations of such concepts.

Wood's exposition of the deduction begins with a "minimal conception of experience" that any skeptic must grant, namely that there is a succession of representations or contents for a numerically identical and continuous subject. According to Wood, Kant in effect argues that minimal experience is possible only if these successive representations are necessarily related to each other in ways that can be known a priori. Here Wood focuses on the so-called subjective deduction in the first edition of the first Critique, where Kant highlights three kinds of syntheses that cannot be given in experience because the very possibility of experience depends on these ways of ordering representations. Their source is the "self-activity of our understanding." Both Wood and Kant assume that because the synthesis cannot be given in the sensible data and is to be attributed to the exercise of our cognitive faculties on this data, this synthesis is "not a contingent and empirical, but a necessary and a priori feature of experience" (p.50).

In the second edition of the first Critique, Kant seriously revises the transcendental deduction and Wood presents this revision as a second step of the deduction. The minimal conception of experience not only requires a threefold synthesis, but also something that plays the role of an object to which the representations or contents of minimal experience can be referred. In other words, a condition of the possibility of minimal experience is the possibility of a richer experience that involves the experience of objects that "count as going beyond those merely subjective representations of minimal experience" (p.51).

Accordingly, for Kant an object is fundamentally understood in terms of objectivity, which in turn is understood in terms of making judgments, for example affirming that a piece of cinnabar is red. Relying on Kant's discussion of judgments of experience in the Prolegomena and the Critique of Judgment, Wood emphasizes that making such a judgment involves claims that this is so not only now in my minimal experience, but at other times and, more importantly, for other subjects as well. Thus Kant's notion of objectivity, on Wood's reading, involves a normative component. What makes cinnabar an object is that we can make judgments about it that have built-in a normative demand that this judgment holds for other times and for other subjects.

This reconceptualization of objecthood in terms of normativity has important consequences for the concept of truth. Truth can no longer be correspondence between our synthesized and conceptualized representations and something sui generis distinct from these representations. This seems to point in the direction of coherence rather than correspondence, but Wood comes to Kant's defense and argues that this indeed is correspondence. What is conceptualized, according to Wood, is "grasped as something given in intuition" (p.54). The synthesized and conceptualized representations involved in the judgment that cinnabar is red include the thought that if true, something "should correspond to the object, as to a thing that is, or at least that could be, somehow immediately present to us" (ibid.). The notion or thought of correspondence is built into the very possibility of experience.

For most skeptics, that we must synthesize representations so that they are represented as corresponding to an object that should or could be given in intuition falls short of the claim that such objects obtain and that such conceptualized representations are instantiated. Perhaps falsehoods and uninstantiated concepts are necessary conditions of human experience.

Kant's struggle with this sort of objection is documented by the addition of the Refutation of Idealism in the 2nd edition of the first Critique where, as Wood points out, Kant attempts to argue for the conclusion that the objects we intuit "must be distinct from all our representations" (p.60).

In chapter 4 Wood turns to the question of the thing in itself, the concept of something independent of all our representations. Wood considers two basic interpretations of Kant's concept of a thing in itself. According to the first reading, things in themselves are distinct things that cause the representations that constitute human experience. The second reading is that things in themselves are not distinct from the objects of experience, but that they are things that appear in experience. Wood call this second reading the "identity interpretation," noting that this does not entail that they are identical in every aspect. The object can be viewed as how it appears to us -- as an object of experience -- and as it is in itself independent of our experience.

Wood believes that Kant's text does not give us enough evidence to settle the dispute between these two readings and that Kant moves back and forth between these incompatible approaches. On systematic grounds, however, Wood rejects the causality reading of Kant's thing in itself and endorses the identity interpretation. It should be noted that the identity interpretation was developed in great detail by Gerold Prauss in the 1970s arguing persuasively on the basis of computer analyses of Kant's text that Kant's preferred locution is not "thing in itself" but locutions such as "thing as it is conceived in itself" and variations thereof.

As will be gathered from the above discussion, Wood's treatment of the first Critique so far leaves the topic of the influence of the anthropology behind. Wood returns to this topic in his discussion of the Transcendental Dialectic in chapter 5. Wood defends Kant against the charge that Kant's solution to the antinomy of freedom has the consequence that free agents "must feel alienated from their natural existence, think of their actions as occurring outside of time, and hence be unable to think of themselves as historical beings" (p.98). These criticisms, Wood declares, "are all utterly worthless." Although Kant sometimes does slip into describing free actions as involving noumenal and hence non-empirical causation, Wood argues correctly that this is not necessary to Kant's theory of free agency. All that Kant requires is that freedom and natural causality are consistent with each other, and that beyond that there is nothing positive to say about the nature of freedom. While this still leaves human freedom beyond the scope of human experience and cognition, Wood affirms that this is simply "our condition, and we should simply face up to it" (p.98).

This topic is further developed in chapter 6 on Kant's philosophy of history. A key ingredient for understanding Kant's account of freedom (as well as the other ideas of reason such as the idea of God) is his distinction between constitutive and regulative principles of reason. Ideas such as freedom and God are not necessary for having experience (unlike the concepts of object or cause), but they guide human moral and scientific pursuits.

The study of the history of human beings, which is an empirical study of the empirical facts about what human beings have done and what has been done to them, relies on the regulative principles of reason. The reason that these principles are needed is the anthropological fact that human behavior cannot be completely subsumed under causal laws. Consequently, from an empirical perspective human behavior is not fully intelligible. But intelligibility is a demand of reason, and this is where human beings turn to regulative principles. When it comes to individual human actions, the idea of freedom, that is acting on the basis of reasons, is used to regulate the empirical evidence we have regarding human behavior. Collective observable human behavior is made intelligible with the regulative idea of the natural purpose of the human species. Kant refers to the disposition to develop capacities best fitted for their way of life, or that human beings seek to circumvent natural causation and develop their reason free from instinct. Kant uses this to explain changes in production and economic organization.

Wood emphasizes the role of conflict in Kant's view of the human species and its history. Kant introduces conflict with his concept of unsocial sociability. One of the significant features of Wood's reading is that it highlights this concept from Kant's philosophy of history and uses it to illuminate his moral and political philosophy. It is an empirical fact about human beings that they are at the same time inclined to live in society and to live as individuals, and that they are inclined to "direct everything in accordance with their own ideas." Accordingly, they compete and seek to dominate each other, in part to establish their individuality and distinguish themselves from the rest of humanity.

This "self-conceit" of human beings that they are better than others is not only a source of unhappiness and disorder for which Kant seeks remedies in morality and politics, but it also contributes, Kant maintains, to the development of human faculties and abilities. This is an example of Kant's reliance on regulative principles. Unsocial sociability is an empirical fact that, in itself, is unintelligible, but the regulative principle that the human species seeks to develop its capacities is used to account for this empirical fact.

The progress that unsocial sociability drives includes the development of technology, and this includes the technologies of war. However, for Kant this is not an abiding fact about human beings. As Wood points out, for Kant the contributions of war to human development belong to the early stages of human development, and in later, more civilized stages, war ceases to contribute to the natural purpose of human beings to improve themselves. The further progress of human capacities, including productive capacities, requires a peaceful international order.

Wood recognizes that Kant's reliance on a heuristic principle of the natural purpose of the human species is, in Kant's hands, a collective and unconscious purpose or end of the species, and this today seems "extravagant", "obscurantist" and incompatible with methodological individualism, because for Kant this purpose is not embodied in individual human beings. At the same time, Wood is quite right to point out that "abstract idealizations" play a role in contemporary social sciences, particularly economics, and these outstrip empirical observation as much as Kant's regulative principles.

In chapter 7 Wood turns to Kant's ethical theory after his philosophy of history. Here Wood makes a strong case that Kant's anthropology is essential to his ethical theory. Wood takes his cue from Kant's Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, which is divided into two parts: metaphysics of morals and practical anthropology, and he writes that "it is too seldom appreciated that Kant … treats practical anthropology as a necessary part of ethics" (p.133).

Perhaps the centerpiece of Kant's ethics is that ethics is about self-control aimed at checking our natural, psychological desires. Wood argues that what grounds Kant's moral perspective is his anthropological thesis that human beings are driven by their natural self-conceit or unsocial sociability. The role of moral duty is to serve as a force that balances our unsocial drives. The categorical imperatives, according to Wood, must be understood as principles that oppose our self-conceit that our wants and desires are "privileged exceptions to laws we think all other rational beings should follow" (p.139).

Ironically, for Kant the recognition of moral duty is a product of unsocial sociability. Human self-conceit leads to the development of reason, but reason, Kant assumes, recognizes the dignity and incomparable worth of rationality wherever it may be found. Reason develops a sense of humility that one's own rationality is not special or unique, and this conflicts with self-conceit. Respect for rationality, then, is what morality embodies and it includes the duty to search for concord. The greater our rationality, the less we are driven by unsocial sociability.

Wood defends Kant's ethics against the charge of formalism. First, the categorical imperatives are not inflexible rules without exceptions, and Wood points out that Kant indeed discusses exceptivae or exceptions to moral rules (p.131). Second, Wood argues that Kant's first two formulations of the categorical imperatives were not intended to be universal decision procedures. On Wood's view, there are specific moral duties already in place that are not derivable from these imperatives. Violations of these duties involve maxims that make the agent into an exception to a law or duty that the agent already believes everyone else has or should follow.

The third formulation, however, namely the command that humanity, whether in yourself or others, be always treated as an end and never as a means only, does have positive moral content on its own, according to Wood. This imperative enjoins us to respect the reasons and ends of individual human beings and anthropology is relevant because we are enjoined to pay attention to the particular standpoints that human beings in fact have, that is, their projects, reasons, intentions, beliefs, and so on. People's ends or intentions, no matter what they are, need to be considered in our own deliberations. This does not entail that we must accept these reasons, but it does mean that in our deliberations and interactions we address those reasons.

On account of the fact that to respect humanity is to respect the ends rational beings set for themselves, Wood argues that Kant's moral theory is teleological and not deontological. Without ends, the categorical imperatives are without a field of operation. Wood does grant that there is one end that the categorical imperatives do command independently of the ends human beings already have, namely that human beings set themselves ends. The categorical imperative is possible only if we have ends in view when we act and thus the imperatives demand that we be purposeful beings.

In chapter 8 Wood turns to Kant's third Critique, namely Kant's aesthetic theory. Wood's discussion centers on the main topics of the Critique of Judgment, namely the nature of judgments of taste and beauty, but he also addresses the relevance of beauty and taste to morality and religion. He maintains that for Kant the primary point of aesthetics is that it motivates our ability to think from the standpoint of others. In making an aesthetic judgment we are aware of our individuality and at the same time concerned that our judgment that something is beautiful be shared by others. Moreover, when experiencing a beautiful object, we are free of any specific interest in that object save for the interest that this object continue to exist. This disinterestedness in aesthetic experience is akin to or perhaps even representative of the moral point of view. At the very least, aesthetic experience reminds us of morality.

Wood is quite harsh about nineteenth-century adaptations and assimilations of Kant's aesthetic theory, particularly of the concepts of the sublime, genius and natural purpose. Although the third Critique has been an inspiration for post-Kantian idealism, Wood maintains that Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel did not understand or appreciate Kant's position. The feeling of the sublime is not a source of cognition and freedom, God and natural teleology are regulative ideas that are not required to experience objects. The duality of constitutive and regulative principles is certainly a duality essential to Kant's philosophy, but it is also a duality that Hegel, for example, explicitly rejected.

The final chapter of Wood's book is devoted to Kant's political and religious philosophy. Wood emphasizes that Kant sharply distinguishes political or juridical rights from ethical ones. Ethical rights and duties must not be coerced or enforced by a sovereign, but must come from one's own conscience. The only standard for the laws of a coercive sovereign is the preservation of external freedom, namely the freedom of action. The legislation of morality actually undermines both morality and the state, as Wood notes. But there is a point of intersection of morality and politics because it is the respect for humanity that grounds the state's role to preserve a person's "independence of being constrained by another's arbitrary will" (p.173).

But Kant's position on the limitations of the state does not translate into a neo-liberal position on wealth, taxation, and private property. For Kant, the state is the "supreme proprietor" of all land and taxation; to support the poor is a juridical duty that does not rely on charity or beneficence. The reason is that wealth and property depend on political institutions and their laws, including laws that protect the poor. Private property, then, is not a primitive relationship, but (here Kant follows Hobbes) something made possible by the state.

Similarly, Kant constrains the behavior of states. States do not have a right to interfere in the internal affairs of another state or invade the territory of another state unless there is an explicit contract with the indigenous population permitting the intervention. On this basis Kant condemned the rule imposed by Europeans over indigenous populations in the Americas, Africa, and Indonesia (p.178), and Wood does not hesitate to apply this to current wars. For Kant, justifications in the name of civilization are irrelevant and self-serving rationalizations for self-aggrandizement.

Kant also sharply divides church and state. While the only legitimate function of the state is to preserve freedom, the "proper function of religion is to bring human beings together for the purpose of the collective moral improvement of the human race" (p.180) Religion is necessary for moral improvement, but moral improvement is not within the purview of the state. In fact, as observed above, state interference on moral issues is detrimental to morality because morality can only come from within. But at the same time, moral improvement on Kant's view, as Wood shows, requires community because human self-conceit can be best checked by participation in the building of an ethical community. This is part of Kant's conception of enlightenment, which includes thinking for oneself, that enlightenment requires the public exercise of one's rational capacities.

The reason religion is needed for moral improvement is that what Kant calls an "ethical commonwealth" requires the possibility and rational hope that justice is rewarded and injustice punished. But this requires the regulative postulation of the existence of God. That justice is not rewarded is an empirical, anthropological fact, and for Kant the only way we can think that there are conditions under which this is not the case is by relying on a God that ensures the distribution of goods commensurate with morality.

In light of these proper roles for church and state, Kant concludes that both are in need of reform, as Wood highlights. Kant's political critique is directed at states not safeguarding external freedom, while religion is criticized for not preserving inner freedom. Religion is typically based on dogmatic assertions and amoral constraints on behavior (e.g., what to eat or wear) imposed by "tyrants, who have done more to enslave than liberate the mind and spirit" (p.183). Positive or moral religion would avoid creeds and catechisms, the distinction between clergy and laity, and service to God would simply be the fulfillment of one's moral duties. It might be pointed out that this significantly overlaps with theologies of individual conscience as represented by Pietism, the Brethren movement, and Quakerism.

Wood concludes this broad, deep, sympathetic and critical introduction to Kant's synoptic philosophy with Kant's final words from his Lectures on Anthropology that the improvement of the human moral condition requires more than a contractual agreement amongst individuals. What is needed is "the progressive organization of citizens of the earth into and toward the species as a system that is cosmopolitically combined" (p.186). Thus Kant must not be seen only as part of a liberal political tradition conceived narrowly only in terms of liberal capitalism, but as part of a broader tradition that includes liberal socialism as well.