Kantian Conceptual Geography

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Nathaniel Jason Goldberg, Kantian Conceptual Geography, Oxford University Press, 2015, 271pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190215385.

Reviewed by Colin Marshall, University of Washington


The central question of this book is whether empirical terms, concepts, and properties have both subjective and objective sources. To understand this broad question, we need to know (a) what it is for a term, concept, or property to be empirical and (b) what subjective and objective factors are. Unfortunately, Nathaniel Jason Goldberg leaves "empirical" undefined. He explains "subjective source" as follows:

By 'subjective source' I mean the specific conceptual, linguistic, or perceptual capacities in an individual subject's mind, shared across a group of subjects' minds, or encoded in a subject's or subjects' language or (other) conventions. Different philosophers have chosen different elements of this set. (p. 8)

An objective source is defined as a "source that is not subjective." This can include "objects in the world . . . , sensations deriving from those objects . . . [and] the world itself, in itself, or considered in itself, if construed in a subject-independent way" (p. 8).

Given these definitions, one might think that it is trivially true that, setting aside properties, empirical terms and concepts have subjective and objective sources in Goldberg's sense. On any familiar sense of "empirical," empirical terms and concepts depend essentially on subjects' linguistic and conceptual capacities (subjective sources) and on objects or sensations deriving from objects (objective sources). Goldberg does not regard this issue as trivial, however. He aims to explain and defend the following claims:

Ontological Kantianism: All empirical concepts, terms, or properties are constituted essentially out of subjective and objective sources. The subject source may take the form of subjective constitutive principles. (p. 10)

Epistemological Kantianism: All empirical concepts, terms, or properties are acquired by a subject's appealing essentially to subjective and objective sources. The subject source may take the form of subjective acquisitive principles. (p. 12)

Ontological Kantianism concerns the constitution of concepts' content, terms' meaning, and properties' nature. Epistemological Kantianism concerns how we acquire concepts, terms, and (in some sense) properties. Goldberg thinks each view contrasts with four other types of views: (1) Platonic and Aristotelian realist views, which hold there are only objective sources, (2) Berkeleyan idealist views, which hold there are only subjective sources, (3) Lockean hybrid views, which hold that only some empirical entities have both sources, and (4) Hegelian pragmatist views, which deny the subjective/objective distinction.

Though Goldberg favors the Kantian views over the alternatives, he denies that his primary aim is to argue for them or for any particular claim. His primary aim, instead, is something "more important," namely "surveying the lay of the conceptual land" (p. 28). Such conceptual geography, Goldberg holds, can be thought of "as a prolegomenon to any future epistemology, philosophy of language, or metaphysics -- Kantian or otherwise" (p. 250).

After introducing the Kantian theses, Goldberg argues that the views of Philip Pettit, Thomas Kuhn, and Donald Davidson are all versions of Kantianism. Goldberg approaches Kantianism in terms of response-dependence, largely following Crispin Wright's treatment of this topic. In discussing Pettit's views, he claims that every kind of Kantianism entails some form of Noumenalism, according to which reality has an unknowable aspect or nature. In discussing Kuhn's views, he links differences in subjective sources to the possibility of incommensurability. Davidson's view, Goldberg claims, offers a clear example of principle-based Kantianism, given Davidson's use of the principle of charity in determining meaning. A general lesson Goldberg draws from discussing Pettit, Kuhn, and Davidson concerns one dimension of variation among forms of Kantianism. Different Kantians, Goldberg argues, give different 'scope' to the relevant subjective sources. A subjective source can be either paradigmatically human-centered, community-centered, individual-centered, or language-centered. Differences in scope will imply differences in potential incommensurability.

Goldberg thinks that the most serious threat to Kantianism comes from Davidson himself, in his argument against the scheme/content distinction. Goldberg breaks down Davidson's argument into two parts, but his central criticism seems to be that Davidson is himself committed to some notion of empirical content (an objective source), which is distinguished from the principle of charity used in interpretation (a subjective source). Another type of threat to Kantianism, Goldberg holds, concerns its appeal to subjective principles. The most important manifestation of that threat, Goldberg thinks, comes from Quine's arguments. He argues that while Quine's arguments might have force against a Kantian like Carnap, they do not have force against the views of Michael Friedman. Friedman's appeal to actual conventions in history gives him a stable way of identifying subjective principles, Goldberg claims.

After discussing Davidson's and Quine's arguments, Goldberg turns to comparing the merits of Kantianism with those of rival views. Realist views, he claims, face the problem of providing a "bridge to objects existing independently of subjects" (178) and have trouble explaining the meaning of empty terms. Berkeleyan idealist views run up against strong intuitions that objects have some role in the empirical. Hybrid views, insofar as they break with Kantianism, face the problems of realism and idealism. Finally, pragmatist views that deny the subjective/objective distinction run up, as do idealist views, against intuitions about the importance of objects.

Goldberg grants that Kantian views also face a number of apparent problems. He holds that only three problems are really worth taking seriously, however, and that there are replies even to these. The first serious problem is that Kantianism threatens to make the existence of empirical properties subject-relative. The second serious problem, linked to the first, is that Kantianism might posit a plurality of empirical worlds, relative to different subjects. The third serious problem, built upon the second, is that Kantianism allows subjects to move between different empirical worlds. Goldberg's main response to the first two problems is that only some kinds of Kantianism face these problems. If the relevant subjective source has a universal scope, then there will only be a single set of empirical properties (relative to a single group of subjects) and so only one empirical world. Goldberg's main response to the third problem is that, even given multiple empirical worlds, movability between them can be explained using something like Kant's negative sense of 'noumenon,' that is, with an appeal to whatever lies beyond the boundaries of subjects' worlds.

Many of Goldberg's arguments (especially those concerning Davidson) deserve a more detailed discussion than I can offer here. In the remainder of this review I offer some general critical comments.

Goldberg's boldest claim is that conceptual geography is more important than defending any particular view. This is not an off-hand remark. Goldberg devotes large portions of the book to locating extant views relative to his general Kantian principles and comparing different forms of Kantianism. One of the most interesting questions the book raises is whether this geography-first view is right. Now, it cannot be right that all forms of conceptual geography are worthwhile. Consider the following principle:

Disjunctive Naturalism: All empirical terms, concepts, or properties are natural.

This principle could serve as the starting point for a project in conceptual geography. That project would begin by explaining different senses of "natural," locating various extant views relative to different senses of the principle, and comparing disjunctive naturalist views with each other. It is hard to see how that project would be worthwhile, however. One of the achievements of recent philosophy has been to carefully separate out different senses of "natural." There would be no obvious benefit to lumping those senses back together for geographic purposes. In addition, the disjunctive form of Disjunctive Naturalism (besides creating logical ambiguity) also invites wildly different views to be grouped together. A Platonist could agree that all terms are natural (in a variety of senses) yet deny that any properties are natural (in any sense). Naturalism-based geography would group such a Platonist view together with contemporary physicalism. That grouping would not serve any purpose, and it is hard to see how it would be more important than determining whether, say, Platonism is correct.

These worries carry over to Goldberg's Kantian geography. The principles at the center of that geography hinge on the notions of subjectivity and objectivity, which recent philosophers have shown to be multiply ambiguous. The disjunctive form of Kantian principles also leads to the same sort of disparate groupings as Disjunctive Naturalism would lead to. For instance, the view that all empirical terms involve subjective and objective factors, as mentioned above, sounds trivial. By contrast, the view that all empirical properties involve subjective and objective factors would be a fairly radical form of idealism. Any number of general, disjunctive principles might group these views together, but it is not clear what that grouping would achieve. It is even less clear how that grouping would be more important than figuring out, say, whether idealism is correct.

That worry is exacerbated by some of Goldberg's terminological choices. As noted above, he includes sensation in his list of objective sources. That makes it hard to see how even, as Goldberg claims, Berkeleyan idealism would fall outside of Kantianism. For Berkeley certainly thought sensation was essential for all our mental life and for the existence of the physical world. Similarly, Plato surely thought subjective capacities were necessary for spoken language even if objective forms were involved as well, so it would seem Plato was also a Kantian.

Another odd terminological practice in the book concerns "a priori." Goldberg distinguishes two senses of apriority, an ontological sense and an epistemological sense. The former sense is about deriving from a subjective source, while the latter is about being insusceptible to empirical justification (p. 36). Recall that perceptual capacities are subjective sources. Color-blindness, then, would count as an a priori factor in the ontological sense for Goldberg. The epistemological sense of apriority is defined purely negatively. Cats, semi-colons, imperatives, and contradictions are insusceptible to empirical justification and so would all count as epistemologically a priori for Goldberg. These implications show Goldberg's uses of "a priori" differ significantly from mainstream uses. In many part of the book, these terminological issues do not affect the main points Goldberg wants to make. Nonetheless, maps are more useful when they use symbols in a familiar way, and Goldberg never explains why he opts for non-familiar uses like these.

Finally, these geographical issues undermine the significance of some of the book's main arguments. Goldberg argues that Kantianism is defensible primarily by showing how apparent objections to it only apply to certain forms of Kantianism. This is not surprising, however, given how broadly Kantianism is defined. Analogously, it would be hard to find any single argument undermining Disjunctive Naturalism, but that is just what one would expect. In addition, Goldberg's arguments against opposing positions are made in such broad, suggestive strokes that they are hard to evaluate. Yet, if those opposing positions are comparably broad to Kantianism (as Goldberg seems to think), it is hard to see how Goldberg's arguments could have force against all specific versions of them.

What could be said in defense of Goldberg's Kantian conceptual geography? Goldberg says little about this on a general level and seems to think that the fruitfulness of his project will be clear in the details that result from it. To conclude, then, I will describe one possible line of defense of the general project.

The defense begins with the following thought. Perhaps there is something artificial about the many distinctions that recent philosophers been drawn between different senses of "subjective" and "objective," as well as the sharp distinctions they have made between terms, concepts, and properties. Perhaps, that is, our most fundamental concepts are the undifferentiated concepts of subjectivity, objectivity, and term/concept/property. That would explain, after all, why it is a perennial challenge to teach undergraduates to make more precise distinctions, such as clarifying what they mean by "objective" and distinguishing a culture-dependent theory of language from the culture-dependent theory of truth. If our fundamental concepts are the undifferentiated ones, then we humans might not be able to avoid using those undifferentiated concepts in philosophy. In that case, the most useful map might be one that used broad concepts of objectivity and subjectivity and that grouped together issues concerning terms, concepts, and properties. That would not show that more local-focused, precise philosophy was mistaken, but it might show that locally-focused philosophy should spend more time locating itself on a general map like the one Goldberg provides.