Kantian Ethics: Value, Agency, and Obligation

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Robert Stern, Kantian Ethics: Value, Agency, and Obligation, Oxford University Press, 2015, 284pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198722298.

Reviewed by Oliver Sensen, Tulane University


The book is a collection of essays by one of the leading Kant scholars and eminent philosopher, Robert Stern. The volume contains 14 articles, seven of which deal directly with Kant's moral philosophy and contemporary interpretations of it, while the other seven cover an impressive range of later receptions of Kant's work. The topics of the later essays include Hegel's charge that the Categorical Imperative is empty (Chapter 8), a Kantian reaction to Hegel (Chapter 9), one chapter each on obligation and perfectionism in T.H. Green and F.H. Bradley (Chapters 10 and 11), William James's account of freedom (Chapter 12), K.E. Løgstrup's critique of Kant (Chapter 13), as well as an article on Stephen Darwall and G.E.M. Anscombe on divine commands (Chapter 14).

Although Stern covers many authors, the essays all center around one main topic of moral obligation, and more specifically on the following three problems: How is obligation possible? Does Kant's account of obligation imply a realist or (constructivist) anti-realist moral outlook? What implications does the account have for our agency? As a result, the claims of the different articles mutually support each other and make up a more substantive treatise on moral obligation and its implications. The book is full of smaller insights, which alone would make it worthwhile to read, but rather than listing those, I shall present Stern's views on the three main topics, and submit a few critical remarks in the hope that they might stimulate further debate.

The first main question that Stern addresses is how moral obligation is possible at all. He starts out with Schopenhauer's critique that obligation implies an external lawgiver who can coerce someone with threats and punishments (1-4). However, assuming an external lawgiver, such as God or a state that provides the moral law, seems to violate Kantian autonomy. One would be bound by the will of another, and not self-legislating.

Stern's Kantian solution, which he mainly lays out in Chapter 1, is that the obligating force is not created by an external lawgiver, but by an internal relation within the agent. Stern illustrates the point by contrasting a holy will that does not have any inclinations with our human finite will, which has inclinations that might go against moral commands. For a holy will, there would be no resistance to morality and no imperatives. A holy will naturally does what is morally right. However, human beings are tempted by inclinations, which often go against moral commands. One might not desire to tell the truth even if it is the right thing to do. It is this contrast between reason and inclination, Stern points out, that makes it possible to explain the necessitating force of a moral must.

However, while I agree with Stern's analysis of Kant, it seems to me that it does not answer Schopenhauer's objection. There is a difference between the reason why an action is morally necessary, and the psychological feeling of being constrained. Stern explains the origin of the "psychological force" (29) of moral obligation, why one might have a feeling that one must do something. But in order to answer Schopenhauer's objection, it seems to me, one would need to explain how a moral command can have an internal source. To illustrate my point, think of cases where the obligating reason and the psychology of it come apart. In his Lectures on Ethics, Kant gives the example of a conscience that is too strong. In that case we might feel obligated, but objectively we are not. Conversely, there are cases where I might be obligated to help someone, but where it does not feel like a must at all, for instance, if one also feels sympathy or love for the person in need.

In order to answer Schopenhauer's challenge, one needs to explain how an obligation can originate within an agent. Kant's answer seems to me to be that reason gives a moral law a priori. I agree with Stern that this law only feels like a categorical imperative to beings tempted by inclinations. A holy will would necessarily act in accordance with that law, but against Schopenhauer we have to answer the question why there is an a priori moral law at all, even for a holy will.

The most important contribution of Stern's book, it seems to me, is his proposal of a hybrid view for interpreting Kant's meta-ethics. There is a fierce debate in the Kant literature over whether Kant is a moral realist or an anti-realist constructivist. Constructivists, mainly Rawls and his students, base their interpretation on Kant's emphasis that morality consists in a law of reason, not intuited facts, and that he explicitly places what is right in this sense prior to the good. Realists, such as Allen Wood, Rae Langton and Dieter Schönecker, on the other hand, see the foundation of Kant's moral philosophy in the value of humanity, and object that constructivism would turn Kant's moral philosophy into an arbitrary creation by human beings.

Stern's novel solution to this debate, which he lays out in Chapters 2-5, is a hybrid view that can accommodate both Kant interpretations. According to Stern, Kant is an anti-realist about obligation, but a realist about moral rightness. As he argues in Chapter 1, the necessitating force of moral obligation is created by human agents. However, he reads Kant as saying that there are also objective values as part of the "fabric of the world" (91). These values determine what is morally right, but one is only obligated to do what is right because of one's own autonomy. As far as I can see, this is a novel solution to a central problem of Kant scholarship, and a welcome move to heal its rift.

Stern develops two main arguments for value realism over the course of Chapters 2-5. (a) The first is a negative argument that Kant's views on autonomy do not undermine the existence of objective values. (b) Stern then argues positively that Kant's passage in the Groundwork that leads up to the Formula of Humanity (volume 4, pages 427-9 in the Academy Edition) positively supports the interpretation that Kant assumes the existence of objective values. I shall present and discuss each argument in turn.

(a) Constructivists sometimes argue that the existence of objective values would undermine the autonomy of the agent. In Chapter 2, Stern analyses three versions of the argument from autonomy and ultimately rejects them. His core response is that objective values would not undermine the autonomy of an agent "any more than I lose my freedom by following the laws of . . . a legitimate state." (3) Likewise, the existence of objective values would not undermine one's ability to determine oneself freely.

However, it seems to me that this rebuttal is only plausible if one understands autonomy as the ability to consciously choose for oneself. I believe that this is not the correct interpretation of Kant's conception of autonomy. The reason is one that Stern also acknowledges (cf. 51-2). Kant introduces the concept of autonomy in order to explain the bindingness of moral commands, but if he were to understand autonomy as free choice, this would not be enough to generate moral bindingness. If one freely adopts a New Year's resolution, for instance, one can always unbind oneself from it.

One can explain moral bindingness if autonomy is the claim that moral laws do not originate from an external source, but from one's own reason. On this reading, the moral law has an a priori origin; it is a constitutive function of how one's reason operates. This interpretation can avoid the charge that one can always freely unbind oneself from obligations, and thereby avoid the realist charge that constructivism leads to arbitrary commands (cf. 51-2).

If one accepts this interpretation of autonomy, then, I believe, one should also construe the argument from autonomy differently. The emphasis of the argument should not be, as Stern seems to hold (cf. 50-3), on a premise that laws need lawgivers. Against this premise one could argue that mathematical laws do not need lawgivers (cf. 53), and so moral values do not have to be tied to lawgivers either. I believe that the emphasis should be again on the bindingness of moral commands (cf. 18 n. 10). If there are objective values 'out there,' how do they obligate one to act in a certain way? It seems that an external reality can only bind oneself in virtue of a desire one has or an "interest by way of attraction or constraint, since it did not as a law arise from his will" (Groundwork 4:432-3). The same thought applies to laws of mathematics or mechanics, however one construes their source. The laws of mechanics do not command unconditionally. Only if one has a desire to build a bridge, for instance, ought one to follow the laws of mechanics. Their bindingness is conditioned upon a desire.

If my reading is correct, then the argument from autonomy does question the moral bindingness of objective values. However, this by itself does not undermine Stern's hybrid view. First, his hybrid view acknowledges that the function of objective values is not to explain the bindingness of morality, but to generate moral rightness, and the argument from autonomy does not refute the existence of objective values, only their unconditional bindingness. Second, Stern also presents a positive argument for the assumption of objective values.

(b) In Chapters 3-5 Stern locates the positive argument in Kant's Groundwork passage that leads up to his Formula of Humanity, the command to never use someone as mere means, but always at the same time as an end in itself (cf. 4:429). Stern reads Kant as presenting roughly the following argument (cf. 96-103): (i) Kant assumes that there is a categorical imperative that is valid for all human beings. (ii) He then searches for a reason "for the sake of which one acts" (102) in accordance with the law, i.e., a motivating reason. (iii) This reason cannot be an end we set from inclinations, because these ends are all relative and would not yield a universal moral law. (iv) By eliminating relative and subjective ends, it then follows that the end must be an objective end, something that has an objective value.

What is new and especially noteworthy about Stern's argument is how he reads the passage in which Kant argues why human beings have to regard others as ends in themselves:

The ground of this principle is: rational nature exists as an end in itself. The human being necessarily represents his own existence in this way; so far it is thus a subjective principle of human actions. But every other rational being also represents his existence in this way . . . thus it is at the same time an objective principle" (Groundwork 4:428-9).

Scholars often read this passage as if Kant is saying that I have to regard myself as objectively valuable, and therefore have to regard others the same way. This argument does not seem to follow, and Stern submits that the contrast is not between the agent and other human beings, but between human beings as a group, on the one hand, and other rational beings on the other (cf. 100).

However, it is not clear to me that this passage establishes moral realism. I briefly want to submit a few reservations about the steps of Stern's argument in order to spark further discussion: (i) It is not clear that at this point in the Groundwork Kant assumes that there is a universal moral law. Only one page earlier he seems to doubt it: "The question is therefore this: is it a necessary law for all rational beings" (4:426)? (ii) That Kant raises this question makes it doubtful that here he is trying to find a motivating rather than a metaphysical or epistemic ground of the moral law. Furthermore, Kant repeatedly says that the motivating reason should only be respect for the moral law itself. Why does it all of a sudden need an end?

I grant step (iii), but (iv) raises further questions: It is not clear to me why the assumption of an objective end is a claim about the "fabric of the world" (91). How does the assumption of realist values fit with his rejection of any such properties in the first Critique? Furthermore, how would the claim that all human beings have this worth fit with Kant's famous claim that only a good will can have such a worth (cf. Groundwork 4:393)? Do all human beings have a good will?

Stern also discusses the implications of Kant's account of obligation for our agency. Chapters 6 and 7 deal with the principle 'ought implies can.' Stern's main claim is that Kant believes that a 'cannot' undermines moral obligation, but not moral rightness: one could not be obliged to do something one cannot do, but it still could be wrong not to do it. While I find Stern's analysis plausible, and want to commend him for asking central questions hardly anyone has asked before, I wonder whether the emphasis should be placed somewhere else. For Stern analyzes a modus tollens version of 'ought implies can': 'If I ought, then I can; I cannot; therefore I ought not.' Kant uses this principle in his Lectures on Ethics, however, in his published writings he seems to use modus ponens versions of the principle instead: 'If I ought, then I can; I ought; therefore I can.' In the Critique of Practical Reason, for instance, Kant argues for freedom: "He judges, therefore, that he can do something because he is aware that he ought to" (volume 5, page 30 in the Academy Edition). Kant uses a different modus ponens version in his discussions of the highest good. There he concludes from an 'ought' to a 'hope that one can' (cf. Religion 6:51). Stern's excellent questions could be raised about these principles as well.

In addition to the quality of the arguments, I also recommend the book for Stern's writing-style. Each of the 14 essays is very clearly written. They each contain close textual analyses that advance the scholarship on the particular author, and Stern's reflections on the systematic plausibility of each argument enhances the systematic debates on topics such as obligation, value or moral agency. Stern has previously published on many different aspects of philosophy, and one characteristic of his writing that I find particularly refreshing is how he uses distinctions from other areas in philosophy to sharpen our understanding of Kant's philosophy.

Stern's book is an important advancement of central debates in Kant scholarship. I highly recommend it to Kant scholars and anyone interested in moral philosophy of a Kantian bent.