Kantian Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Allen W. Wood, Kantian Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 342pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521671149.

Reviewed by Noell Birondo, Pomona College


Two perennial doubts can linger in the minds of people working in the history of philosophy. Those who approach philosophical problems in a systematic, analytic spirit may come to think that work in the history of philosophy fails to amount to genuine philosophy; and those who are more historically-minded may come to think that the very same work fails to amount to genuine history. In this rich and rewarding new book, Allen Wood nevertheless succeeds in delivering a defense of Kantian ethics that should satisfy, in terms of its philosophical credentials, any philosopher interested in ethics; and it should also satisfy, in terms of its historical credentials, anyone interested in the ethical thought of Immanuel Kant himself.

Roughly the first half of the book covers some central Kantian ethical concepts, treated with Wood's characteristic incisiveness: reason, moral worth, the moral law, humanity, autonomy, and freedom. Roughly the second half of the book covers topics not already treated in Wood's previous writing on Kant's ethics, or treated less thoroughly there. These topics include not only virtue, duty, and conscience, but also social justice, punishment, sex, and (crucially) an astounding chapter on lies. In my view the book will succeed wonderfully as a supplementary text in a course on Kant's ethics, or on the history of ethics. But the chapter on lying already makes the book indispensable to anyone hoping to bypass the most pervasive caricatures of Kantian ethics. (That is by no means the only chapter about which one can make that claim.)

There are Lies and Then There are Lies

While each of the chapters devoted to an 'applied' moral issue challenges some common misperception of Kant, Wood's account of Kant on lying strikes me as so incredibly valuable that it should be summarized here immediately. Long before he wrote his notorious essay on lying -- the one that sadly lends itself to being misunderstood -- Kant originally offered, as his own preferred example, the following completely straightforward case of lying (Metaphysics of Morals 6:431). An officer comes to the door inquiring of a servant whether the master of the house is at home. In Kant's view, if the servant intentionally answers untruthfully, allowing the master to slip away and commit a crime, then the servant is guilty of being an accomplice to the crime. In a context such as this, Kant's view is that the officer can rightfully demand that the servant answer truthfully, in the sense that the servant, and not the officer, will bear responsibility for the actions that result from the officer's believing what is said.

Kant refers to the type of answer required in this sort of quasi-legal context as, in Wood's translation, a "declaration" (Aussage, Deklaration) (p. 241). According to Wood's specification of this Kantian notion, "a declaration occurs in a context where others are warranted or authorized (befugt) in relying on the truthfulness of what is said," and a declaration can "make the speaker liable by right, and thus typically subject to criminal penalties or civil damages, if what is said is knowingly false" (p. 241 my emphasis). But, according to Wood, Kant's technical conception of a lie (Lüge, mendacium) is the conception of "an intentionally untruthful statement that is contrary to duty, especially contrary to a duty of right" (p. 240). Hence any knowingly false  'declaration' is a lie, since it will be contrary to a duty of right; and the following traditionally incendiary Kantian claim is merely an analytic proposition: All lies are contrary to duty.

By contrast, an untruthful statement that does not amount to a 'declaration,' is merely a falsiloquium -- merely a "falsification" (p. 240). While many of the details of Wood's discussion of lying remain (regarding especially what a proper Kantian response should be to the different case of a murderer at the door) it should certainly be enough here just to include a passage from Kant's ethical lectures that I, at least, had never seen (nor seen anyone mention) before I read this book. (The citation is Ak 27:447.) Regarding the general topic of committing a falsiloquium, of saying something intentionally untrue when there is no 'declaration' in play, Kant says that:

I can also commit a falsiloquium when my intent is to hide my intentions from the other, and he can also presume that I shall do so, since his own purpose is to make a wrongful use of the truth. If an enemy, for example, takes me by the throat and demands to know where my money is kept, I can hide the information here, since he means to misuse the truth. That is still no mendacium.

What this means is that if someone shows up at the door with murderous intent, and if, in addition to that, she is not in a position to demand a 'declaration' from me, then I can indeed, on Kant's view, tell her something intentionally untruthful. As Kant understands this technical notion, that is still no lie.

Kant's Ethics and Kantian Ethics

As its title already suggests, this book proceeds by pressing a distinction (familiar from the work of Onora O'Neill) between Kant's ethics and Kantian ethics. The former is answerable to "textual accuracy or exegetical standards of Kant interpretation" and the latter is answerable to "the standards for thinking philosophically about ethical theory," while also being formulated in "the basic spirit" of Kant (p. 1). In spite of that distinction, however, one of Wood's central aims in the book is to discredit the practice of perpetually redrawing certain familiar caricatures of Kant, even though the caricatures bear no resemblance to the picture Kant himself presents. This dubious strategy enables the caricatures to constitute the villain in a philosophical worldview -- "the stiff, inhuman, moralistic Prussian ogre" (p. xii) -- and it therefore lends certain ethical theories an artificial plausibility, resulting from a trumped-up contrast.

What makes it possible for Wood to develop the most plausible version of Kantian ethics (by his own lights of course), while also vindicating Kant, is Wood's rejection of what is easily the most influential contemporary version of Kantian ethics -- the "Kantian constructivism in ethics" that was initiated by John Rawls, and that has since been championed by his many distinguished students and followers. On a broadly Rawlsian version of Kantian ethics, rational beings construct moral principles by employing objectively valid procedures for doing so. The procedures are supplied by the various formulations of the Categorical Imperative (perhaps especially by the Formula of Universal Law), and the objective validity of the resulting moral principles is taken to follow from the fact that the procedures are the correct procedures (not vice versa). "My version of Kantian ethics," Wood says, "will be much closer to Kant's ethics than I think the Rawlsians' are, or were meant to be" (p. xi). That will count as a charitable reading of constructivism, given Wood's view that constructivism, considered as an interpretive claim about Kant, "gets Kant's entire conception of ethical theory, as well as his conception of autonomy and his position in metaethics … basically wrong" (p. 46). Considered in its own right, Wood says he regards the phrase "Kantian constructivism in ethics" as an "oxymoron," whose "interest ought to lie exclusively in its shock value" (p. 46).

In what follows I focus mainly on the issues Wood mentions in the passage just quoted -- on the proper Kantian conception of ethical theory, and then, more briefly at the end, on the relationship between autonomy and Kantian metaethics. The issues bear less overlap with Wood's 1999 book Kant's Ethical Thought (also from Cambridge University Press) than the other chapters in the present book devoted to the central Kantian ethical concepts. The issues should therefore be of interest even to those who have already done themselves the favor of reading Wood's earlier book on Kant's ethics.

A Place for Substantive Moral Judgment

Before turning to those issues, a few comments simply have to be interjected about what is by far the book's most idiosyncratic feature. This regards the open disdain Wood expresses, throughout the book, for the political situation in the United States during the period in which the book was written. In Wood's view, the history of the U. S. between 2004 and 2006 was nothing short of "disgraceful." And he warns his readers (rightly) that the book has taken on a certain character, having been written during that time, under an Administration that seemed to Wood like a "malignant alien occupation." He warns in particular:

There are references here and there in the book to this dismal history, usually to illustrate arrogance, lying, and egregious violations of right. A few readers of my earlier work have told me they think this sort of thing inappropriate in a scholarly book. But my worries about appearing "unscholarly" pale next to my shame, which all Americans should feel at having failed to prevent the disastrous course events. (p. xiii)

Of course some people will find Wood's moral pronouncements inappropriate -- and others will find them outright annoying. But the presence of these substantive moral claims, in what is after all a book on ethics, struck me as fairly refreshing -- and, what is surely more important, they would have done so even if I strongly disagreed with the moral claims at issue. It might be helpful in general, as it seems to me, for writers on ethics to be as forthright as Wood is here about their own substantive moral views. One might, for instance, take a rather more guarded view of the ethical claims made, even at the level of theory, by someone who advocates the military obliteration of Israel -- or, alternatively, of someone who advocates (what is obviously no less deplorable) the military obliteration of Iran. Such views are surely fantastic, the ravings of moral lunatics. (It's worth acknowledging, of course, that in moral philosophy as generally practiced today, there is no objection to the possibility that someone who is a moral lunatic might also be a respected ethical theorist. That says something about how ethical theory is still generally conceived today, as willfully sanitized of anything touching ethical life.)

The suggestion here is not the terrifyingly pietistic one that no one should be licensed to write on ethics who displays even the least of moral vices -- if that were true then all moral philosophy would have to be suspended. The point is actually just a modification of that familiar thought from Aristotle, the one displayed when he restricted the audience of his ethical lectures to those who shared enough of the "starting points" necessary for ethical discussion to proceed. The suggestion here is, similarly, that one is presumably better off knowing, for similar reasons, the "starting points" of someone whose work one is reading, maybe especially in moral philosophy.[1] Wood's forthright expressions of moral outrage are, in any case, pervasive enough that anyone who reads the book will frequently be forced to react to them, one way or another. They could hardly go without mentioning here.

The Kantian Conception of Ethical Theory

In Wood's view, twentieth-century moral philosophy was unhelpfully mesmerized by one dominant conception of ethical theory. The conception usually advertises itself with a Rawlsian label -- "reflective equilibrium" -- but according to Wood its best articulation actually appeared at the end of the nineteenth century in the work of Henry Sidgwick. On Wood's characterization of Sidgwick's "intuitional" or "scientific" conception of ethical theory, the starting point for moral knowledge is "a set of moral judgments, sometimes about principles, but mainly about the moral rightness or wrongness of particular actions in actual or possible cases" (p. 43). Such judgments are of course not taken to be infallible; and, in fact, the task of ethical theory is "to reconcile initially conflicting judgments and principles … so as to produce the most coherent overall explanation of our intuitions" (p. 44). As Wood rightly emphasizes, this characterization of ethical theory fits especially well those ethical theorists who appeal to "cartoonishly abstract" moral examples, ones that sometimes even involve "science fiction in their conception" (p. 49). Such theorists tend to favor (somehow especially) runaway trolley cars in which one pulls the lever that averts the greatest calamity, life-boats from which one can save only one's spouse or a complete stranger or Bill Gates, and hospital scenes in which one, as surgeon, can cut up one relatively healthy patient in order to save the others. Such abstractions do perhaps have a "scientific" feel about them, maybe like a physicist's appeal to a frictionless plane. And such abstractions may also be indispensable to achieving the overall "scientific" aim of ethical theory on this conception of it: "to settle all moral questions and make all moral decisions, as far as possible, by rigorous derivation from precisely stated principles" (p. 47).

This dominant conception of ethical theory often takes itself to be the only plausible option for engaging in moral philosophy at all, and so proponents of Kantian ethics can seem to be doing Kant a favor when they find this conception at work in his texts. For instance, a proponent of Kantian ethics might take the Formula of Universal Law and treat it as "a universal moral criterion for the permissibility of maxims, to be tested against our intuitions regarding the best cases that inventive philosophers can devise as apparent counterexamples" (p. 45). For Wood, understanding the Formula of Universal Law in that way -- as a kind of "CI-procedure" that must accord with our 'intuitions' -- is a very serious mistake. "This way of understanding Kantian ethics," he says, "could hardly get Kant's conception of ethical theory more wrong even if it tried" (p. 45).[2]

By contrast, Wood insists that a properly Kantian conception of ethical theory will be "foundational" instead of "intuitional," and "philosophical" instead of "scientific." It will be foundational because it attempts to rest ethics on something objective, on something anterior to individual moral agents, rather than on people's 'intuitions.' Surprisingly, this will mean that Kant and Mill have something they can agree about. For while Kant's defense of morality is a priori, and Mill's is a posteriori, they both attempt, according to Wood, "to provide a philosophical interpretation of what we are committed to simply in rationally desiring ends and willing actions toward them" (p. 55). Intuitions therefore have "no role whatever to play in Kant's arguments" for the three formulas that together make manifest the supreme principle of morality (p. 56). Notoriously, Kant's own defense of the supreme principle of morality takes place in Section Three of the Groundwork, where everything "stands or falls with freedom of the will" (p.117); or at least with the practical necessity of regarding the will as free.

Since Wood aims both to vindicate Kant and to validate Kantian ethics, we should ask whether this Kantian conception of ethical theory is superior to the available alternatives. A good answer can begin by noting that ethical theory, as practiced by the best contemporary defenders of virtue ethics, fails to be either "scientific" or "intuitional," at least in the objectionable ways most targeted by Wood. Aristotle famously insists (in a passage Wood cites) that it would be foolish to expect, in ethics, the same precision one rightly expects in math, and it's unlikely that any defender of virtue ethics will want to correct Aristotle about that. Thus it turns out that Aristotle's conception of ethical theory -- which Sidgwick and Rawls both claim to be following -- explicitly renounces any aim of being "scientific." Nor are the defenders of virtue ethics likely to allow an appeal to cartoonish examples in developing their mature ethical theory. The most prominent virtue ethicists that come to mind (mainly Aristotelians) are more likely to appeal to examples from Jane Austen, Henry James, and Tolstoy than to examples involving, for instance, science fiction in their conception. They presumably wouldn't be caught dead appealing to someone on a trolley car. So this Aristotelian conception of ethical theory also fails to be "intuitional" in any obviously damning sense. But if it is neither "scientific" nor "intuitional," then there is an alternative to Wood's Kantian conception of ethical theory that simply isn't being considered here at all. If the 'Sidgwickian' conception is the only alternative, then the Kantian conception looks great by comparison.

As for Wood's own rejection of trolley car examples (in order, e.g., to determine the validity of the Formula of Universal Law): his thinking here reflects what has probably been his most distinctive thesis regarding the interpretation of Kant's ethics. Wood's thesis is that in spite of its being the formula perpetually seized upon by Kant's detractors, as well as by some of his most faithful defenders, the Formula of Universal Law remains only "the most provisional formula, the merely formal one, hence the least adequate at expressing the content of the principle" of morality (p. 69). In Wood's view, we do better to focus on the Formula of Humanity as End in Itself, a formula "specifically motivated" (p. 75) by questions one might raise about the formalism of the Formula of Universal Law. Even so, opponents of Kantian ethics may object that the Formula of Humanity fails to deliver sufficiently determinate moral guidance. According to some ethical theorists, that is, the Formula of Humanity is hopelessly vague. One of Wood's most intriguing (and most memorable) responses to that objection, however, is that we fail to understand the practical implications of the value of human dignity mainly because our current political and social institutions are "almost infinitely far" from providing for its protection. "For example," Wood says,

in the course of the debates over his policies of torturing detainees who are held indefinitely without charge or trial, George W. Bush referred, with evident impatience, to the Geneva Convention prohibition on "outrages upon human dignity," exclaiming: "That's very vague! What does that mean?" Philosophers who charge the Formula of Humanity with vagueness must beware lest their quibbling too should begin to sound like a fatuous confusion of limitless depravity. (p. 57)

In case those comments fail to get his point across, Wood also comments that the Geneva Conventions speak, not of "outrages upon human dignity," but of "outrages on personal dignity," Bush being "famously no diligent student of human rights or the international legal documents that seek their protection" (p. 286, n. 13). On a "philosophical" conception of ethical theory, being diligent about the ethical factors one is likely to confront is essential, since "Kantian principles do not, all by themselves, necessarily determine in advance the answers to [difficult] moral questions" (p. 105). As Aristotle insisted, and as Wood rightly acknowledges, moral agents will also need to be equipped with a morally discerning type of practical judgment. They will need to be equipped with "practical wisdom."

Kantian Metaethics: "Autos" and "Nomos"

While many people think the very best thing about Kantian ethics is its being based on the notion of autonomy -- on our ability to govern our own lives in accordance with rational principles -- they might also think that autonomy should be the first thing to mention about Kantian ethics, not something saved for last. But what I want to emphasize here is Wood's understanding of the relationship between Kantian autonomy and the best Kantian position in metaethics. Not even a brief account of that relationship would make sense at the outset.

When the time comes to think about autonomy, Wood says that advocates of Kantian ethics are forced to confront the following dilemma. They can insist that the crucial thing about Kantian autonomy is the "autos" -- that rational agents legislate for themselves the rational principles that govern their actions. But this first choice bears the burden of having to explain the significance of the "nomos." How can something legislated by rational agents amount to something that genuinely binds them? How can something like that amount to an objective and universally binding moral law? On the other hand, Kantians can insist that the really crucial thing about Kantian autonomy is the "nomos" -- that the principle of morality is grounded in the objective value of humanity as an end in itself. This second choice bears the burden of having to explain the significance of the "autos." As Wood nicely characterizes this side of the dilemma, if we emphasize the "nomos" in Kantian autonomy, then "we have to treat 'self-legislation' as just a certain way of considering or regarding a law whose rational content is truly objective and whose authority is therefore independent of any possible volitional act we might perform" (p. 110). Either way, only half of the Kantian notion of autonomy is taken literally, while the other half apparently needs to be explained away, as a useful way of regarding what is actually or literally going on. One might therefore be inclined to rebel, and to insist that there really has to be a third option -- a Kantian source of normativity that avoids the apparent drawbacks of both 'voluntarism' and 'realism.' But according to Wood there simply is no third choice. While allowing his reader to choose her own metaphor, Wood insists that "in the end you always have to face the music, take your pick, and come clean about it" (p. 110). (This is one place where the book remains, as it does in certain chapters, slightly less polished than Kant's Ethical Thought.) Why should anyone think that the proper stress lies on the "nomos"?

Wood argues that his constructivist rivals simply cannot accommodate certain central passages in Kant's writings on ethics. For instance, Kant writes that:

The essence of things does not alter through their external relations, and it is in accordance with that which alone constitutes the absolute worth of the human being, without thinking of such relations, that he must be judged by whoever it may be, even by the highest being. (G 4:439)

While the passage is not especially accessible, one of the most forceful points in Wood's reading of it is. He notes that, for Kant, something has a property absolutely when it has that property "irrespective of its relations to other things," and, in particular, "independently of the way it is regarded or considered by anyone" (p. 112). Kant's view in this passage therefore seems to be that the worth of human beings is independent of the way it is regarded by anyone. Such worth is something human beings have essentially, simply in virtue of being what they are. Wood says that this passage amounts to "as unequivocal an assertion of metaethical realism as you could ask for" (p. 112). In light of this and similar passages (especially from Kant's ethical lectures), Wood says that "you simply cannot read Kant as a metaethical antirealist, however you may choose, with charitable intent, to subvert his ethical theory in your own appropriation of it" (p. 112).

In my view, interpreting Kant as an ethical realist is almost certainly correct.[3] Yet there obviously remains a very serious, and a very different, question about whether ethical realism (or 'metaethical' realism) is the best option, philosophically speaking, for contemporary Kantians. Of course if someone antecedently thinks ethical realism is correct, and if he is a Kantian, then he will look for arguments that favor a realist Kantian position in ethics.[4] Such arguments would show how to develop a Kantian version of ethical realism, but they would not show (what is quite another thing) that a realist Kantian position is superior to its constructivist rivals. Thus Wood's central criticisms of Kantian constructivism -- qua ethical theory, not qua Kant interpretation -- might not have been so often confined to the endnotes. While his thoughts there are certainly illuminating, a more central discussion would have greatly enhanced the overall strength of Wood's otherwise forceful realist defense of Kantian ethics.

Allen Wood's book remains an indispensable contribution to contemporary ethical theory if for no other reason (and there are many) than its condemnation of the all-too-common tendency for people, even philosophers, to advance their own positions by encouraging, or by not actively discouraging, gross caricatures of their competitors. As Wood demonstrates so effectively here, the familiar caricatures of Kantian ethics amount to just one more make-believe villain, in the service of someone's peddling a philosophical worldview.[5]

[1] On the folly of taking too seriously the ethical claims of those with manifestly deplorable characters, see Julia Annas, "Being Virtuous and Doing the Right Thing," Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 78 (2004) pp. 61-74.

[2] For doubts about whether the main idea in constructivism involves a reliance on the Formula of Universal Law as a procedure for 'testing' maxims, see Andrews Reath, "Agency and Universal Law" (especially p. 222, n. 19), in Reath's Agency and Autonomy in Kant's Moral Theory (Oxford University Press, 2006).

[3] Wood says his general discussion of 'metaethical' realism, as an interpretation of Kant's ethics, "obviously reflects the influence" of an "excellent article" by Patrick Kain (p. 294, n. 7). For an extended defense of this interpretation, see Kain's "Self-Legislation in Kant's Moral Philosophy," Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 86:3 (2004) pp. 257-306. For other realist interpretations of Kant's ethics (both pre-dating and post-dating Kain's paper) see ch. 11 of Karl Ameriks, Interpreting Kant's Critiques (Oxford University Press, 2003); as well as Rae Langton, "Objective and Unconditioned Value," Philosophical Review 116:2 (2007) pp. 157-185.

[4] Although my own Kantian sympathies only run so deep, I have indicated one route by which Kantian ethical realists might attempt to reach their destination. See "Kantian Reasons for Reasons," Ratio 20:3 (2007) pp. 264-77.

[5] Thanks are due to Peter Thielke for his extremely helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.